Honor in Political and Moral Philosophy

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Peter Olsthoorn, Honor in Political and Moral Philosophy, SUNY Press, 2015, 216pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438455471.

Reviewed by Adam C. Pelser, United States Air Force Academy


True to the description on the back cover, Peter Olsthoorn's book is more a "history of the development of ideas of honor in Western philosophy" than a philosophical defense of the proper role of honor in political and moral life. Yet, Olsthoorn relies on his discussions of both historical and contemporary accounts of honor to support the claim that, despite its reputation as an antiquated concept, honor can still be valuable for contemporary society. He nicely summarizes the scope and intent of the book in the introduction when he writes, "Drawing on moral philosophy from Cicero to Amartya Sen this book argues that honor, despite its limited role in our moral language, still has a role as a heuristic tool and an incentive to do what is right" (12). Olsthoorn thus identifies two valuable roles for honor in moral and political life. First, a concern for honor makes people attentive to the way that their actions are (or would be) viewed by others; thus, in a society that adheres to generally good moral standards, honor can help people to see and know the morally right way to act. Second, a desire for honor can be an effective motive for acting rightly.

While Olsthoorn acknowledges that honor has an internal aspect -- viz., a kind of desire to be a virtuous or honorable person in one's own eyes -- he focuses throughout the book on the underappreciated moral value of the external aspect of honor -- viz., the desire to do what is right in the eyes of others for the sake of being seen and valued by others as a virtuous or honorable person. He observes that such a desire for external honor strikes many people in contemporary Western society as decidedly unvirtuous:

Many people today seem to share the Stoic suspicion that virtue and honor do not go hand in hand. With the Stoics we tend to think that people are to be virtuous from a love of virtue, not from a fear of losing face, and that a virtuous act undertaken for honor is not really a moral act -- the term moral seems somewhat out of place in such a case. (62)

In response to this worry, Olsthoorn argues not that the desire to receive honor from others is morally admirable, virtuous, or otherwise praiseworthy, but rather that a concern for honor is morally useful and even necessary since more virtuous or morally pure reasons are not sufficient to motivate most people to act rightly. He concedes,

Perhaps we should follow Hume on this point . . . and accept that it might be unrealistic to expect people to do what is moral from moral motives only. Often we follow moral rules, not because they are moral, but because not following them brings disesteem, and practice virtues, not out of a love of virtue per se, but because it brings praise, esteem and approbation. (157)

Those readers looking for empirical support for the claim that a concern for honor is a more effective motivator of moral behavior than other "purer" moral motives will have to look elsewhere. Olsthoorn's argument for this claim begins and ends by citing observations of human behavior found in the writings of philosophers such as Marcus Tullius Cicero, David Hume, and Adam Smith.

In addition to these philosophers, Olsthoorn discusses the views of honor and related concepts present in the writings of Seneca, John Locke, Bernard Mandeville, Jean-Jacques Rousseau, John Stuart Mill, and Alexis de Tocqueville, as well as many other historical and contemporary philosophers. Throughout the book, he illustrates and applies his claims concerning the nature and value of honor through discussions of poignant literary examples, such as Jim from Joseph Conrad's Lord Jim, Vronski and Anna from Leo Tolstoy's Anna Karenina, and Julien Sorel from Stendhal's The Red and the Black. These are interesting case studies since each of these well-drawn characters possesses a sincere concern for honor and yet acts dishonorably, a point that Olsthoorn draws on in his discussion of the limitations of honor as a motive to act morally. Olsthoorn's analysis also includes extended discussions of the role of honor and related concepts such as loyalty and respect in the context of war and military ethics, one of the few remaining aspects of Western society in which honor is still explicitly valued. This book is well worth reading for its thorough presentation and analysis of the historical development of the concept of honor in Western thought, but I will not discuss the specific details of that historical account here. For the remainder of this review, I will focus instead on the main philosophical argument of the book, which, while intriguing, is somewhat elusive and underdeveloped. The following exposition is thus intended both to clarify the main argument of the book and to provide a critical evaluation of some of its details.

As intimated above, Olsthoorn argues that honor -- or, rather, a concern for honor -- is valuable both heuristically and motivationally. Having presented some initial arguments from the history of philosophy for the value of (a concern for) honor (ch. 1), he distinguishes the classical, aristocratic notion of honor, which amounted to public recognition of the socially elite by their peers often for acts of military valor, from democratic honor, which can be won by most people, regardless of social class, through acts that are more socially "productive" than the "destructive" acts of war (ch. 2). Olsthoorn then turns his attention to some worries about the limitations and shortcomings of democratic honor, which he answers by discussing the connections between the concept of honor and the related concepts of loyalty, integrity, and respect (chs. 3-5). It is in the context of these discussions that Olsthoorn offers his most interesting and original insights.

The first shortcoming of relying on a concern for honor as a moral teacher and motivator that Olsthoorn identifies has to do with the relativity of honor to an honor group. He acknowledges that it would be a mistake to equate honorable action with morally right action since a concern for honor typically only motivates people to do what is right in the eyes of their honor group and not all honor groups have good moral values. He argues that an implicit concern for honor from one's honor group often motivates people to act in ways that manifest group loyalty, which can be at odds with proper treatment of those outside one's honor group. He notes that the democratization of honor has widened the boundaries of honor groups, but not beyond national boundaries.

Of course, any plausible moral outlook will call for proper treatment of all people, even foreigners and others outside one's honor group. Olsthoorn thus concludes that it would be good if we could tie people's concern for honor to loyalty to moral principles rather than loyalty to honor groups, but he expresses pessimism about the extent to which this is possible. As a more psychologically plausible alternative, he recommends tying the concern for honor to loyalty to a profession, where the profession's standards of behavior include an expectation of proper treatment of and concern for those outside one's honor group (i.e., one's clients). For example, he cites the way in which the medical profession explicitly encourages impartial treatment of and concern for patients (97). Even a doctor who does not view her patients as members of her honor group will still be motivated to treat them impartially, since failure to do so could result in the loss of esteem from her professional peers.

Olsthoorn concludes his discussion of loyalty by registering some reasons for optimism about the possibility of expanding our honor groups beyond national boundaries to include even the foreigner and the stranger, while maintaining a valuable role for loyalty to one's family, friends, and neighbors (104). The kind of virtuous loyalty he describes here seems to be less the kind of unquestioning allegiance he describes in his discussion of group loyalty, however, and more a kind of special care or love for those closely related to one. It seems a bit of a conceptual strain to consider such preferential loving care a kind of loyalty, thus weakening his attempt to rescue loyalty as a virtue.

Another problem for his discussion of the relationship between loyalty and honor is that it is not clear why he thinks loyalty to a profession with the right set of "outward-looking" ethical principles is better suited than loyalty to a nation with the right set of ethical principles to bridge the gap between the concern for honor from one's honor group and proper treatment of those outside one's group. Since he claims that many people in Western society see their nation as their honor group, why couldn't national loyalty motivate morally appropriate treatment of foreigners, at least in nations that value human equality and international justice? Setting that question aside, I doubt whether people really do see their honor group as including all citizens of their nation. While it seems plausible that people are willing to extend a special kind of respect to fellow nationals that they don't extend to foreigners, it seems less plausible that people generally care more about being esteemed by all of their fellow nationals than by foreigners. Empirical investigation of this question could help to demonstrate just how inclusive most people's honor groups really are.

Of course, tying the concern for honor to the ethical principles of one's honor group, whether it be a professional community, a national community, a religious community, or otherwise, will only be morally beneficial if one's community's moral standards or values are good. Olsthoorn thus considers whether the virtue of integrity is better suited than group (or professional) loyalty for connecting the concern for honor with moral action. He expresses pessimism here, though, on account of his understanding of integrity as a kind of "loyalty to personal principles and values" (107). Insofar as integrity is tantamount to being "true to oneself" or an "authentic" moral agent, integrity is no better suited than group loyalty to align an agent's motivations with the right moral principles and values. While some who have written on the nature of integrity -- notably Lynne McFall,[1] whose influential article Olsthoorn does not explicitly discuss -- take this as reason to qualify the virtue of integrity with reference to reasonable moral standards, Olsthoorn takes it as a reason to conclude that integrity "is as gray a virtue as group loyalty" (131).

Having argued that neither group loyalty nor loyalty to oneself (integrity) is sufficient to bridge the gap between a concern for honor and a good moral life, Olsthoorn argues in his final chapter that the most promising corrective for the inherent liabilities of a concern for (or sense of) honor is an attitude of respect for the dignity of all people. He claims that respect is well-suited to correct for the inherent limitations of honor because, though arguably "a descendant of the old notion of honor," it is "not a constant-sum game" (133). That is, while there is only so much honor to go around, this is not the case with respect -- showing respect for someone does not mean having less respect left to show others. Moreover, he observes that respect is more at home in duty-based ethics than in virtue ethics, and he suggests that the former is a "somewhat less self-regarding strand of thought" than the latter (133). Rather than developing and defending these claims in detail, however, Olsthoorn spends the bulk of his chapter on respect discussing the nature of humiliation and the tangentially related issue of the humiliation, or lack of (perceived) respect, of the Arab world by Western powers as a potential motivation for terrorism.

In the end, then, Olsthoorn's primary claim seems to be that a concern for honor can play a morally beneficial role as a teacher and motivator, but that it must be tethered to (objectively) appropriate moral standards and that this requires, at a minimum, proper respect for the dignity of all people. While I am sympathetic with this conclusion, let me register two final worries about details of Olsthoorn's argument.

First, regarding his discussion of respect, I do not find it helpful to identify respect more closely with duty-based ethics than with virtue ethics, as Olsthoorn does. Given that one standard way to conceive of the virtues is as character-level dispositions to act, think, and feel in the right way, at the right time, toward the right objects, etc., what reason is there for thinking that there could not be a virtue of respect for human dignity? In keeping with the description of respect Olsthoorn provides, a person with such a virtue would be disposed to act, think, and feel in respectful ways toward all people, regardless of sex, race, nationality, etc. Moreover, why should we think that such an understanding of respect as a virtue would be at odds with, or would be any more self-regarding than, understanding respect primarily as a duty owed to others? That a sense of respect is less self-regarding than a sense of honor seems right, but this does not seem to have anything to do with these attitudes (or virtues) being the exclusive property of one ethical tradition/theory or another.

Lastly, it seems that Olsthoorn's case for the moral value of honor (or, rather, a sense of honor) could be used to demonstrate not that a sense of honor is a necessary, though unvirtuous, incentive to act morally, but rather that a sense of honor actually can be virtuous. He writes, "Although occasionally listed as a virtue, honor is in fact not a virtue at all; it is above all a reward for virtuous behavior" (69). But if, in the right social conditions, the approval and esteem of others can be morally illuminating and motivating, a properly ordered desire for the approval and esteem of others might amount to a kind of intermediate virtue. Moreover, since honor bestowed to the virtuous can help those who receive it to serve as public models of virtue and offer them opportunities for positive social and political influence, cultivating a desire for honor as a means to these good ends might be virtuous and even altruistic (cf., Thomas Aquinas' discussion of the proper reasons to desire glory[2]). I should be careful here to clarify, though, that I do not endorse a simplistic equation of virtue with altruism as some ethicists, including Olsthoorn, seem inclined to do. Insofar as the virtues are excellences of human character, it seems entirely virtuous to be concerned, though not excessively so, with one's own achievement of virtue, as well as with the proper recognition and honoring of all kinds of human excellence (including moral excellence) by the public, even when the excellence the public ought to honor is one's own.[3]

[1] Lynne McFall, "Integrity," Ethics 98, 1 (1987): 5-20.

[2] Thomas Aquinas, On Evil, ed. Brian Davies, trans. Richard Regan (Oxford University Press, 2003), Q. IX ("On Vainglory"), a. 1, 343.

[3] The views expressed here are the author's own and do not necessarily reflect the official policy or position of the US Air Force, the US Department of Defense, or the US government.