Hope Under Oppression

Hope Under Oppression

Katie Stockdale, Hope Under Oppression, Oxford University Press, 2021, 213pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780197563571.

Reviewed by Céline Leboeuf, Florida International University


Katie Stockdale’s book addresses the nature and value of hope under oppression. As such, it marks a departure from traditional accounts of hope, which treat this attitude or emotion without regard to the experiences of differently situated populations. Oppression, for Stockdale, is “a threat to hope” (23). Hoping presents a particular risk to the oppressed since their hopes are often “unrealized” (82) and the bitterness that may result from disappointed expectations can undermine struggles to resist oppression. Hence Stockdale’s guiding question: Is hope worth the risk or are other emotional or cognitive states more worthwhile for undoing oppression?

To answer this question, Stockdale surveys everyday evaluations of the place of hope in our lives as well as philosophical accounts of the nature and fittingness of hope. These discussions, occupying the first two chapters of the book, set the stage for her discussion of the relations between hope, anger, and bitterness in the second third of the book. The concluding chapter describes how “faith in the intrinsic value of what [agents] are doing” can give rise to a type of “moral-political solidarity” that strengthens our collective hopes for justice (181). Accordingly, hope can be valuable and worth the risk for the oppressed.

By narrowing her argument to hope under oppression, Stockdale provides an original and welcome contribution to the literature on hope. She positions her work within analytic feminism and contrasts her account with those which neglect the risks of hoping that are unique to the oppressed. She explains that neither the existential nor the pragmatic traditions have taken this risk into account, and earlier analytic philosophy has also largely theorized the nature and value of hope at a general level. To understand the distinct risk of hope under oppression, a few words about Stockdale’s definition of hope. According to her, hope is:

(1) the desire for an outcome, (2) the belief that the outcome’s obtaining is possible but not certain, (3) seeing or perceiving in a favorable light the possibility that the desired outcome obtains, and (4) an explicit or implicit recognition of the limitations of one’s own agency in bringing about the hoped-for end. (19)

This definition offers the theoretical foundations for her appraisal of hope under oppression. Conditions of oppression can weaken one’s belief that a desired-for outcome may eventually be obtained; for instance, repeated injustices can breed pessimism in the oppressed. Furthermore, the agency of the oppressed may be limited and, thus, they may lack confidence in their ability to fight for change.

One of the many insights in Stockdale’s survey of the nature and value of hope lies in her explanation that hope may be marketed to oppressed groups to quell any fight for change. Whereas numerous charitable organizations deploy the word “hope” to motivate responses to injustices, other entities—for example, politicians or corporations—exploit hope to either hold onto power or sell products. Thus, hope is a double-edged sword: on the one hand, it may spur resistance; on the other hand, it may erode it. This second possibility is especially worrisome since oppressed groups are often already deprived of agency.

One merit of Stockdale’s feminist approach lies in her attentiveness to intersectionality. The experience of hopelessness and the risks of hope can become compounded when someone lies at the intersection of multiple forms of oppression. Throughout the book, Stockdale draws attention to multiply-oppressed groups—most notably, Indigenous women in the United States and Canada or Black women. Furthermore, by repeatedly citing the works of women of color, such as Audre Lorde, bell hooks, and Myisha Cherry, Stockdale elevates the voices of authors from groups traditionally marginalized in philosophy.

The originality of Stockdale’s exploration of the relationship between hope and anger also deserves praise. Anger’s political value has recently received considerable attention (for example, Nussbaum 2016, Srinivasan 2018, Cherry 2019). Although these and other contributions differ in their evaluation of the productiveness of political anger, they lay the ground for Stockdale’s analysis, which illuminates how anger and hope can work in tandem with one another. For her, anger in political contexts “often indicates the presence of a hope for repair” (82). That is, anger does not merely concern retaliation but can take a forward-looking form that pushes agents to seek solutions to injustices: their hope for reparations undergirds anger-fueled resistance. In support of this interpretation, Stockdale not only engages with the vast philosophical literature on anger but delves into the role of this emotion in the anti-racist struggles of Black Americans, for example, during the civil rights movement.

Yet, reparations for injustices are never guaranteed, and “the loss of hopes accompanied by our anger responses can result in the emotion of bitterness” (113). Building on this insight, Stockdale argues that bitterness, often devalued in everyday discourse, may be fitting and morally appropriate. One of its virtues, she convincingly argues, lies in “orienting our attention to the people, groups, and institutions in whom there are good reasons to have lost hope” (143). This, in turn, may lead to more focused and effective strategies for fighting oppression. The concern with bitterness, however, is that this emotion can be “damaging because it leads to despair and inaction” (116). Bitterness, therefore, presents a similar problem to hope: bitterness can have moral, epistemic, and political value, but the downside lies in its potential to threaten activism. Nevertheless, Stockdale contends that allied with other attitudes, such as courage or determination, bitterness may play a positive role in countering oppression. It is worth noting that in the chapter on bitterness, Stockdale analyzes Ta-Nehisi Coates’s writings; this welcome departure from the philosophical literature will broaden her book’s appeal.

How can we renew our struggles in the face of repeated losses? Stockdale claims that various forms of faith—whether spiritual faith, faith in humanity, or moral faith—can motivate agents to “believe in the intrinsic value of what they are doing independently of the efficacy of their actions in securing their moral and political ends” (181). To support her argument for the value of faith for resisting oppression, she distinguishes between “propositional faith” (faith that X holds) and “intrinsic faith” (faith in X). For example, someone who has spiritual faith may have the propositional faith that God exists. The form of intrinsic faith of interest to Stockdale consists in a “deep belief in the intrinsic value of one’s actions or way of life” (146). Stockdale, it seems, introduces this discussion to avoid leaning too heavily on traditional forms of faith (in particular, propositional faith concerning the divine). While she is open to the possibility that such forms of faith may play a role in responding to injustices, she offers a secular account of the value of faith to solidarity.

Stockdale’s secularization of faith is worth commending since her account will, as a result, be more likely to garner uptake. Yet, it was unclear why faith needed to figure so prominently in an account of solidarity and hope. In other words, would it not be sufficient to explore how individual hopes for greater justice can give rise to collective hope? In fact, Stockdale successfully addresses this question by describing the phenomenology of collective hope. Individuals may hope for the same outcome, but collective hope only arises when “hopeful feelings” stem from “activity in a collective action setting” (170). So, while the considerations about faith afforded an interesting backdrop to her discussion of solidarity and hope, it was not apparent that such a lengthy examination was necessary.

Stockdale brings a fresh perspective to discussions of hope by focusing on the literature in feminist philosophy and related subdisciplines. Still, it would have been interesting to contrast her perspective with those from other traditions in philosophy. For example, Richard Rorty’s Philosophy and Social Hope (1999) also addresses hope, faith, and collective action. Whereas Rorty highlights the positive value of hope for social progress, Stockdale emphasizes its risks. In this regard, she could have better underlined the originality of her argument.

Stockdale’s thorough study of hope under oppression contributes to a range of fields in philosophy. First, it adds to the literature on the moral psychology of hope (for instance, Adrienne Martin’s How We Hope (2014)) by specifying the challenges inherent in hoping under oppression. Second, the investigation of collective hope highlights the importance of collective emotions to political struggles; thus, it dovetails with other recent works in political philosophy (for example, Cherry 2021 and Falcato and Graça da Silva 2021). Third, this book furthers feminist research on the obstacles to overcoming oppression. It prolongs many conversations in this field—from classical texts on oppression, such as Marilyn Frye’s The Politics of Reality (1983), to contemporary research, such as Macalester Bell’s and Kathryn Norlock’s. On the whole, it will be a valuable book to philosophers in these fields. Moreover, by appealing to historical examples of struggles against oppression, underscoring future threats (in particular, climate change), and exploring texts outside of philosophy, this book will engage readers from a wide range of backgrounds.


Myisha Cherry, “Love, Anger, and Racial Injustice,” The Routledge Handbook of Love in Philosophy. ed. Adrienne Martin, New York: Routledge, 2019.

Myisha Cherry, The Case for Rage: Why Anger Is Essential to Anti-Racist Struggle, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2021.

Ana Falcato and Sara Graça da Silva, eds. The Politics of Emotional Shockwaves, London: Palgrave Macmillan, 2021.

Marilyn Frye, The Politics of Reality, Berkeley: Crossing Press, 1983.

Adrienne Martin, How We Hope: A Moral Psychology, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2014.

Martha Nussbaum, Anger and Forgiveness: Resentment, Generosity, Justice, New York: Oxford University Press, 2016.

Richard Rorty, Philosophy and Social Hope, New York: Penguin Books, 1999.

Amia Srinivasan, “The Aptness of Anger,” Journal of Political Philosophy 26 (2018), 123–144.