How Colours Matter to Philosophy

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Marcos Silva (ed.), How Colours Matter to Philosophy, Springer, 2017, 317pp., $139.99, ISBN 9783319673974.

Reviewed by Dimitria Electra Gatzia, The University of Akron


This volume is ambitious with respect to both number of contributions and scope: there are 18 papers, which cover a wide variety of topics within metaphysics, epistemology, philosophy of mind, logic, mathematics, and aesthetics. The book has three parts: (i) history of philosophy, (ii) aesthetics and philosophy of mind, and (iii) philosophy of language and logic, although there is a nice overlap among these areas. Unlike other anthologies on colour (e.g., Readings on Color by Alex Byrne and David Hilbert, 1996), which survey primarily empirically based philosophy of colour and colour science, this volume is all-encompassing. Various themes extend across the analytic and continental traditions. This approach vindicates Wittgenstein's remark that the riddle of colour is stimulating and not exasperating.

The Ancient Greeks used the term "chroma" when talking about colour. But did "chroma" mean hue, saturation, brightness or all of the above? In "Hue, Brightness & Saturation in Classical Greek Chroma Terms", Ekai Txapartegi argues that Plato's Timaeus provides evidence that in Classical Greek "chroma" referred to hue. (I should point out that a minor correction is needed in table 1 (p. 32): the term "Leukon" (White) is incorrectly translated as "Black" and the term "Melan" (Black) is incorrectly translated as "White".). As Txapartegi notes, Plato mentions approximately ten chroma terms in the Timeaus.

Newton suggested that there are indefinitely many colours. In "How Many Colours?", Kirsten Walsh addresses this claim and argues that it should be understood as an epistemological, as opposed to a metaphysical, claim. She further argues that Newton privileged the seven main colours for aesthetic, not metaphysical, reasons. According to her, Newton's experiments revealed that the light passing through the prism did not retain its circular shape when projected to the screen, as predicted by the received view, but appeared elongated. This observation led Newton to conclude that, contrary to the received view, white light is not pure or homogenous, but is made up of different refractabilities. These findings gave rise to Newton's New Theory, according to which white light can only be produced by combination. Olaf Müller, in his contribution "Goethe contra Newton on colours, light and the philosophy of science", explores the significance of Newton's experiment in light of Goethe's critique. He argues that Goethe rightly noted that Newton's observations were theory-laden. Goethe, therefore, deserves credit for pointing out an inconsistency between the methodological conception of scientists and their actual practices.

In recent years, as Andrew Lugg aptly notes in "Impossible Colours: Wittgenstein and the Naturalist's Challenge", the idea that the philosophical problem of colour is at root conceptual has been abandoned in favor of an empirical approach. Indeed, some philosophers have gone as far as to claim that the problem of colour realism concerns colour properties, not colour language (see, e.g., Byrne and Hilbert, 2003). In this landscape, Lugg writes, "Wittgenstein's discussion of colour concepts is a singularly notable casualty of philosopher's newfound interest in science" (p. 107). Lugg argues that, for Wittgenstein, colour concepts, like mathematical concepts, are systematically interrelated. These relations provide an explanation for why some colour concepts such as 'reddish green' or 'transparent white' are incoherent or linguistically anomalous, while others such as 'reddish blue' or 'transparent red' are coherent. Lugg argues that "Wittgenstein takes 'the logic of colour concepts' to forbid some concepts and allow others in much the same way that the logic of spatial concepts," such as below/above, right/left, "forbids the concept of being above and below and permits the concept of being to the right and in front" (p. 109). For Wittgenstein, an analysis of colour concepts requires careful philosophical investigation, since their logic is far from self-evident. Lugg argues that the idea that facts about opponent processing and the reflection and transmission of light, often cited by naturalists to explain the nonexistence of reddish green and transparent white, do not explain the logical relationship among colour concepts, which is fundamental to Wittgenstein's account. The conclusion Lugg draws is that Wittgenstein's treatment of reddish green and transparent white (and, hence, his conceptual analysis as a whole) has not been shown to be outmoded.

Lugg is certainly not wrong. There are various papers in this volume that pay homage to the Wittgensteinian approach. In "Proofs Versus Experiments: Wittgensteinian Themes Surrounding the Four-Color Theorem", Gisele Dalva Secco and Luiz Carlos Pereira use the Four-Colour Theorem proof, which states that every map meeting certain conditions is admissibly four-colourable, to examine, among other things, the distinction between proof and experiment from a Wittgensteinian perspective. Traditionally, proofs and experiments are understood as means to establish propositions. Wittgenstein distinguishes between two kinds of propositions, empirical and "hardened", based on the function they perform in the system of propositions. For Wittgenstein, "we do not have a mathematical proposition prior to its proof," because such propositions (as opposed to empirical ones) become "mathematical" because they are proved (p. 305). Dany Jaspers' "Logic and Colour in Cognition, Logic and Philosophy" explores the homology among natural colour percepts and logic and its consequences, one of which (he argues) is an internalist conception of colour. On this view, colour representations are generated by the mind, but colours are projected outwards. Otávio Bueno, in "Colors: Presentation and Representation in Fine Arts", argues that colours have a certain phenomenology (a mode of presentation), but not an absolute meaning. Since they do not uniquely specify their meaning, artists are able to use them to represent a variety of different contents.

Kevin Mulligan's "Colours -- Wittgenstein vs. (Katz or Bühler)" extends the discussion by contrasting Wittgenstein's account to Katz's. While Katz is interested in phenomenology, Wittgenstein tells us that "looking does not teach us anything about the nature of colours" (p. 132). For Wittgenstein, what Katz and other phenomenologists think of as non-contingent connections in colour phenomena, appearances and properties are in fact rules for using colour words. Despite Wittgenstein's conviction, however, the question of the phenomenology of colour is interesting in itself. Jean-Yves Beziau's "A Chromatic Hexagon of Psychic Dispositions" explores the relation between colours and psychic dispositions such as feelings, emotions, thoughts, intuitions, desires, or sensations.

Nicholas Unwin's "Explaining Colour Phenomenology" asks a fundamental question about phenomenology: Why do colours look the way they do? Unwin discusses Levine's and Hardin's accounts. Levine (who is interested in alien hues) maintains that we are confronted with an 'explanatory gap': even if we knew everything about the physics of colour and human physiology, it would not explain why colours actually look the way they do. Hardin, by contrast, argues that given the important connections between phenomenology and physiology, it is plausible that the former could be reduced to the latter. Unwin shares Hardin's optimism. He argues that there is some hope for an explanation of hue phenomenology in the fact that we can achieve "small, partial explanations", even if we are not able to "completely bridge the explanatory gap in such a manner as to establish physicalism" (p. 173). Graham Priest's "Things Are Not What They Seem" uses sorites and inclosure paradoxes to argue that contemporary logic can be used to show that colour states can be inconsistent, meaning that something may be both green and not green, even though we do not typically perceive colours as being inconsistent in this way.

In "On Color: the Husserlian Material a Priori", Jairo José da Silva discusses Husserl's conception of the synthetic a priori. He argues that, for Husserl, the rules of a meaningful use of the terms of a language reflect essential semantic legalities related to the things they denote. For Husserl, concepts are either formal (i.e., they lack content) or material (i.e., they characterize material domains). Laws or relations among concepts are analytic if they involve formal concepts such as number, order, part, whole, etc. Laws involving material concepts, by contrast, are synthetic -- they are a posteriori if the conceptual truth is contingent or a priori if the conceptual truth is necessary. Laws that express the (phenomenological) essence of given ontological regions (i.e., extensions of material objects) are synthetic a priori: synthetic because they involve material concepts (ontological regions); and a priori because their truth does not depend on any type of evidential support available in their respective domains (e.g., perceptions) but on conceptual intuitions. In the case of colour, Husserl argues that to state that "An object O is both uniformly green all over and red all over" is materially (not formally) meaningless. For, it is material meaning which depends on semantic rules that rest on the a priori structure of experience (formal meaning is determined by syntactical rules for the uses of linguistic categories).

Quine (1969) seemed to think that colours are neither natural kinds nor have any significance in theoretical science, since they do not figure in the laws of nature. Peter Ross, in "What the Mind-Independence of Colour Requires", accepts Quine's claim that colours are not natural kinds. However, he rejects Quine's assessment of the significance of colours in theoretical science and defends a version of physicalism, according to which colours are mind-independent. The idea of the mind-independence of colour seems to require that it is a primary quality. Ross distinguishes between two models of primary qualities, an historical and a current model. According to the historical model, being a primary quality is sufficient for being mind-independent. According to the contemporary model, primary qualities include fundamental and non-fundamental qualities -- the latter can be explained by the former. As Ross notes, this "expansion allows for change in the qualities that are explanatorily fundamental in science without a resulting change in primary quality status" (p. 141). In contrast to the historical model, the current model treats involvement in causal interactions among objects as both sufficient and necessary for the mind-independence of colour. Ross acknowledges that colour is not a primary quality in either of these models. However, he argues that "looking to primary quality models to understand what's required for the mind-independence of color has been a mistake" (p. 138).

Echoing Ross, Pirmin Stekeler-Weithofer, in "Subjectivity and Normativity in Colour-Distinctions", argues that the question of whether colours are objective or subjective properties is ill stated from the beginning, in part because of the misleading distinction between primary and secondary qualities. Descartes and Locke treated primary qualities such as extension as properties of things in the objective world that exist, in contrast to secondary qualities such as colour, which are associated with subjective sensations. Stekeler-Weithofer argues that this distinction does not allow us to explain the obvious reality of subjective experience. The main reason colour sensation, according to Stekeler-Weithofer, cannot be explained by our physical theories is that "these theories already abstract from the differences of a particular 'inner life' of awareness . . . No singular thing can be fully described and explained in all its relations and details, because it is related, as such, with everything else in the whole world" (p. 212).

The difficulty in locating colour properties within the primary/secondary quality divide is not surprising. On the one hand, colour appears to be a mind-independent property but, on the other, it appears to be mind-dependent. The difficulty of placing colour in the external world has led philosophers to abandon physicalism. Bernardo Ainbinder, in "Dasein is the Animal That Sorts Out Colors", distinguishes between Cartesian anti-realism (defended by Mackie and Maund) and Oxford realism (defended by McDowell and McGinn). Cartesian anti-realism maintains that colours as we ordinarily conceive them do not exist. One such view is discussed by Barry Maund in "Dispositionalism: Democritus and Colours by Convention". He argues that the second conjunct in Democritus' claim "For by convention colour exists . . . but in reality atoms and void" indicates that what he had in mind is a particular type of dispositionalism, one that stands in need of an error theory. This is because Democritus' claim that colours are conventions is true "even if it is true that our colour terms designate dispositional concepts" (Maund, p. 10). Democritus' dispositionalism, therefore, can be best explained in dispositional terms if we include an error component. Oxford realism acknowledges that physical descriptions of the world do not leave any room for colours as we ordinarily conceive them, but maintains that we can avoid anti-realism by revising our ordinary conception of colour.

One such view is suggested by Diana Raffman's "Vagueness, Hysteresis, and the Instability of Color".  Raffman argues that relationalism is preferable to both physicalism and anti-realism. She uses the forced march or dynamic version of the sorites paradox -- an informal version of the argument framed in terms of the hypothetical applications of a vague predicate -- to show that the behavior of colour predicates present a challenge to a physicalist metaphysics of colour. Specifically, she argues that physicalists cannot accommodate experimental findings about the applications of colour predicates by ordinary speakers in a forced marched sorites series. She cites an experiment in which subjects were presented with 37 coloured lights progressing from blue to green ordered in such a way as each light looked the same in colour as the next (Raffman, 2014: 146-156). Subjects were asked to classify each colour light by clicking one of the three boxes labeled 'B' for blue, 'G' for green, or '?' for borderline cases. Unbeknown to the subjects, in two of (the five) conditions the order of the lights was reversed starting either at the blue end or the green end. The results indicated that the same stimulus appeared to have different colours to the same subject. For example, a stimulus that looked blue before the category shift looked borderline afterward.

Unlike philosophers, mathematicians are not interested in colour per se. Rather, they use colours as instruments that aid the heuristics of mathematics. In "The Wonder of Colors and the Principle of Ariadne", Walter Carnielli and Carlos di Prisco note that mathematicians use colours in "finite and infinite combinatories as the best way to understand and think about mathematical similarities" (p. 310). These include the famous Four-colours Theorem (also discussed by Gisele Dalva Secco and Luiz Carlos Pereira, in this volume) and the Principle of Ariadne, which is based on the Greek myth of the Minotaur, according to which Ariadne gives Theseus a ball of yard to unroll as he is descending into the labyrinth to help him avoid the Minotaur.

The volume is so wide-ranging and rich that a single review cannot do it justice. It should offer something of interest to anyone working on the philosophy of colour.


Byrne, A. and Hilbert D. R. (2003) Color Realism and Color Science. Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 26: 3-21.

Quine, W. V. (1969) Natural Kinds. In J. Kim and E. Sosa (Eds.), Ontological relativity and other essays (pp. 114-138). Columbia University Press.

Hardin, C. L. (1988) Color for Philosophers: Unweaving the Rainbow.

Levine, J. (1983), Materialism and Qualia: The Explanatory Gap. Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 64: 354 -- 61.

Maund, J. B. (2003) "Clarifying the Problem of Color Realism". Commentary on Byrne and Hilbert (2003), Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 26: 38-39.

McGinn, C. (1996) Another look at color. Journal of Philosophy 93: 537-553.

Raffman, D. (2014) Unruly words: A study of vague language. Oxford University Press.