How History Gets Things Wrong: The Neuroscience of Our Addiction to Stories

Placeholder book cover

Alex Rosenberg,  MIT Press, 2018, 289pp., $17.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780262537995.

Reviewed by Glenda Satne, University of Wollongong


Alex Rosenberg is a well-known eliminativist, a position that he has rehearsed over many years and that has earned him the epithet 'mad-dog naturalist' (Marshall 2013). According to Eliminativism, our common-sense view of the mind is deeply wrong. Most or all mental states posited by such folk view do not exist and have no explanatory role to play in a mature science of the mind.

In this book, Rosenberg elaborates further such arguments to take issue with historical narratives and, more generally, with the way in which we most pervasively make sense of people's actions and motivations through narratives. His main contention is that such narratives are always wrong or, to put it differently, that they can't possibly be right. The main reason the book offers for this bold conclusion is that narrative understanding relies on the attribution of beliefs and desires to agents, beliefs and desires that are said to cause their actions. These explanations in terms of beliefs and desires are what allow us to explain why someone acted in the way they did -- as when we say that Mary went to the grocery store because she wanted bread and believed that she could get it at the grocery store -- and to predict how someone will act -- as when we say that Mary will go to the grocery store because she wants bread and believes she can get it at the grocery store. Rosenberg contends that this sort of explanation/prediction stance -- characteristic of what is broadly referred to as 'theory of mind' -- cannot be vindicated by any scientific means.

Rosenberg argues that neuroscience itself, our only reliable method to study psychological capacities, shows that theory of mind's posits do not exist (184). The reason is that the best available evidence on how the brain works shows that the brain does not deal with the kind of things that beliefs and desires are supposed to trade with: contents. When we believe or desire, something is believed or desired: that I have bread, that it rains, that the Parliament passes the bill, etc. Beliefs and desires are about something. Rosenberg argues there are simply no contents in the brain and so no beliefs and desires dealing with such contents. This means that there are no facts of the matter, no belief-desire pairings, that can confirm or disconfirm narrative explanations.

The entire book unfolds this argument at a slow pace, much like a suspense story, and it is only on p. 160 that we get to the full realization that neuroscience is the assassin in the plot, and theory of mind, the main character, its victim. After being presented with the assassin and the crime, the book moves on to explain why, even if always wrong, narratives in general, and historical narratives in particular, are so compelling for us. Even if we have no claim to truth or correctness for our narratives, narratives seem to be highly convincing in moving us to act. Furthermore, we cannot but think in terms of them. Rosenberg's explanation for this 'addiction to stories' is that it has been entrenched in us by evolutionary processes that took place over the last million years of natural history. Narrative explanations emerged out of Darwinian processes of natural selection -- or "environmental filtration", in the less purposive parlance Rosenberg prefers -- that allowed our ancestors to coordinate efforts, collaborate and flourish, moving from the bottom to the top of the Pleistocene's food chain. Rosenberg argues that while the basic mechanisms of mindreading pervasive in the animal kingdom, based on mutual tracking and monitoring of animals' behavior, are a sound method for getting agents to coordinate behavior, these mechanisms' more recent successor, the theory of mind, crafted by the use of co-evolved languages, turned those mindreading abilities into a theory with empirical hypothesis about agents' beliefs and desires but no facts to match them. Rosenberg concludes that there are no purposes, no meanings, no contents that rationalize our behavior. As there are no purposes in physics, chemistry or biology, there are no purposes in psychology. Meanings are only more or less useful fictions. Our actions are instead the result of physical, chemical and biological processes that are blind to purposes, meanings or reasons. All there is are neurons firing in interrelated patterns, patterns that support Darwinian processes of environmental filtration at different scales: brain, groups, nations, generations. In this vein, narratives operate by moving our feelings rather than our intellects.

The error historians allegedly make lies in mistaking stories for real explanations, surmising that behind our behavior there are purposes, rational motivations. The book's last chapters propose to replace historical narratives with an evolutionary game theory that explains historical events at different scales as the result of mechanical processes of natural selection without the need to resource to thoughts or purposes behind specific actions (229). This spells doom for the prospects of any explanation of human behavior that genuinely belongs to the humanities: "Once we discover the right methodology, we will be able to take the history of humans away from the humanities and make it the subject of explanations tested and confirmed by empirical science" (240).

The book provides a nuanced study of the best neuroscientific theories on how mammalian brains function as well as a detailed overview of some of the most popular evolutionary accounts of the emergence of homo sapiens, and, as we will see, crafts serious objections to dominant philosophical accounts of the workings of the mind. As is to be expected for such a bold and controversial position, its arguments are bound to raise many criticisms. In what follows, I present only some of the possible objections. In order to do so, I reconstruct the main lines of Rosenberg's argument in terms of four claims and two conclusions and proceed to take issue with each of them:

  1. Historians -- in particular narrative historians -- make a pervasive use of folk psychological explanations, i.e., explanations that describe events in terms of the beliefs and desires of historical agents, including individuals and groups.
  2. In order for folk psychological and historical narratives to be right there have to be facts of the matter about what sentences in such explanation refer to that make them true.
  3. Folk psychological explanations of actions in terms of platitudes about beliefs and desires pairings evolved in natural history closely related to mind-reading mechanisms that allowed our ancestors to deal with cooperation and coordination problems.
  4. There are no interpretative mechanisms in the brain (at any level of description) that can vindicate the attribution of contents to beliefs and desires.

From this Rosenberg concludes that:

  1. There are no facts of the matter that allow us to select belief/desire pairings as those actually operating 'behind' an agent's behavior.
  2. Folk psychological explanations do not track any facts and thus can't be correct.

(6) explains why historians disagree in their accounts of historical facts, since they lack any criteria of correction for their explanations. Historical narratives do not and cannot provide any knowledge. This is in contrast with 'real' sciences, including neuroscience, that according to Rosenberg have reached the realm of harmonious consensus and offer descriptions of objective facts.

Yet each of these tenets is open to criticism. One might for example doubt that historians are ever in the business of attributing exclusive causal efficacy in historical explanations to the beliefs and desires of historical agents. More plausibly, historical agents' beliefs and desires are only one aspect of such narratives, along with many other factors including some of the ones that evolutionary game-theoretical explanations, as the ones Rosenberg prefers, take issue with. Certainly, narrative historians -- and narrativist philosophers of history in particular -- deny that the facts that make historical explanations true are in the brain of historical agents. If there were facts that make narratives true, those would be facts about society, public policies, institutions and so on.

(2) is also a rather controversial claim. It is worth noting that Rosenberg makes almost no reference to the debates in philosophy of mind and philosophy of history regarding how narratives differ from theories. In this way, he fails to properly engage with some of the key questions on which its whole argument hangs, namely, in what sense narratives can be said to be true, and more specifically, whether narrative explanations can be said to have the same kind of conditions of correction that scientific explanations have.

In the domain of philosophy of history, hermeuticists and narrativists alike deny that narratives are in the business of explanation. For them, narratives are performative rather than descriptive: they create history by narrating it. Similarly, narrative accounts of folk psychology (see Hutto 2008, and Gallagher and Hutto 2008) disagree with the idea that narratives vindicate a theory of mind description of our understanding of human behavior. Interpersonal understanding in this view is provided by engaged interaction and second personal conversations in which narratives are transmitted and shared. Third personal attributions of belief and desires constitute by themselves very unreliable means to understand people's behavior, especially so in cases in which the attributee belongs to historically distant or very different cultural backgrounds. These folk psychological explanations are a last resource that we use when we lack a shared narrative or the means to directly access another person's narrative.

Rosenberg also misconstrues to some great extent the state of the art in contemporary neuroscience. Contrary to his idealized picture of the field, there is no widespread agreement on the mechanisms that underlie our understanding of others. Many disagree that they are best described along the lines that Rosenberg proposes, in terms of an innate theory of mind module. Alternatives include scientific theory of mind, simulation theory and interactionist theory, to name a few. Since there is no harmonious agreement in neuroscience about the nature of these mechanisms, it would seem reasonable to expect much disagreement around arguments supporting claims (4) and (5) above.

No doubt many neuroscientists will find (4) and (5) ludicrous. Yet here is where I think the strength of Rosenberg's challenge really lies. It is not historians that Rosenberg is really challenging, or rather, as I explain below, his is not a serious challenge for the humanities, pace his own conclusion in the book. Instead, he raises a serious challenge for neuroscientists and philosophers of mind who claim that there are facts in the brain about what beliefs and desires someone has, facts that can be best described "as representations with content". In a nutshell, if you are a representationist and a theory of mind theorist, you better have an answer to Rosenberg's arguments in support of (4).

Rosenberg's book shows why representationists, i.e., those who claim the brain deals with mental contents, have a problem. If Rosenberg is right, mental contents cannot be vindicated through appeal to conscious experience, functional roles, or by recourse to the internal workings of the brain. We might agree with him that contents are simply not in our heads. But no contents anywhere at all? Rosenberg bites the bullet, committing to the idea that meanings and reference are useful fictions. But this claim makes his own position self-undermining, for how does Rosenberg's commitment to the fictional character of contents square with (2) above? Wouldn't any discourse, including his own, lack truth conditions? To make things worse, the book offers no account of how language -- and theories -- can possibly get things right. This is in my view the main flaw in Rosenberg's argument.

It is difficult to see how Rosenberg's philosophical arguments can possibly be right. In order for these arguments to be right there have to be some facts of the matter that the sentences in the book describe accurately. If content and meanings are illusions, quite in general, as he claims, not only is Rosenberg's philosophical text not even possibly right -- maybe he will bite this bullet and in a Tractarian vein commit to silence -- but science itself is not even possible. Explanations are crafted in languages. If there are no contents, if linguistic contents cannot be vindicated at all, then the humanities and the natural sciences fall together. They all need their sentences to satisfy criteria of correction. Linguistic explanations, scientific or not, have to accord to the facts of the matter that are at issue in order to be true. So, either there is a mistake in Rosenberg's argument, or he, along with the historians and the scientists, must go out of business.

In sum, Rosenberg's book needs an account of how language evolved to be a tool for true scientific explanation, but it does not provide any.

To finish let me sketch what I think such an account would look like. This requires taking issue with the way Rosenberg spells out the details of claim (3) above. As we will see, once it is made clear how language can have meaning and make true claims about things, there is no major obstacle in understanding how reasons can genuinely motivate us to act.

Some of our linguistic practices, though not all of them, are in the business of claim-making. Physical theories, for example, are in this business, and so were past ones even if they ended up being false. This is so because linguistic expressions refer to objects, and predicates attribute properties to things, and they can do both in a fine-grained manner through descriptions provided by language. Because of this, theories are feasible, and sometimes even right. Yet, for this to be possible it need not be the case that contents are already in the minds or brains of individuals in the form of representations or theories of mind. The emergence and functioning of language does not presuppose the operation of theory of mind mechanisms. This is where Rosenberg's phylogenetic account of language as co-evolving with complex theory of mind mechanisms goes wrong. Yet, he is right that there is no need for original mental contents in the mind of individuals in order to explain how interaction, coordination and collaboration are possible. How so?

We can understand the emergence of language as starting off from non-contentful ways of mutual tracking and monitoring of behavior that allowed and fostered diverse forms of joint action between early hominids (see Satne 2016, Satne and Salice 2020). This in turn allowed the institution of social norms, some of which are already present in other great apes' communities (see Cheney and Seyfarth 2007; Andrews forthcoming). Specific linguistic norms, including those of reference and truth, emerged much later and, with them, discourses about reasons on why and how to act developed, reasons that can formulated, critiqued and revised by the means of natural language (Satne 2020). Yet these reasons need not be described in terms of beliefs or desires of agents; they can be understood as descriptions of states of affairs that are related to other such descriptions. No need for a theory of mind so far. Common sense explanations in terms of beliefs and desires of individual agents can be thought to emerge as a consequence of such practices of individual and joint practical reasoning rather than the other way around. We can then agree with Rosenberg that folk psychological platitudes about beliefs, desires and how they connect to behavior emerged late in natural history -- very likely, I will add, springing from pre-existent narratives that shaped the everyday life of our ancestors.

With this richer picture in view, we can see how narratives of various kinds can be said to shape our ways of thinking about things and have intricate relations with our reasons to act. There is no obstacle here in understanding how we can say true things about the world and ourselves, nor about how reasons can be objective and track facts. Although narratives are not always the best way of getting at facts about what people do, sometimes they can get things right. Making sense of these practices does not require contents to somehow be realized in our brains; rather, our brains and our bodies are entrenched and interconnected with public languages and cultural practices that shape our responses to the world.

Rosenberg's thought-provoking book is to be praised for persuasively articulating the challenge of making sense of our cognitive practices once we have given up the idea of original representational contents. Although what I have said here might suffice to show how Rosenberg's challenge can in principle be addressed, much more needs to be said to fully meet it.


Andrews, K. forthcoming. "Naïve normativity: The social foundation of moral cognition". The Journal of the American Philosophical Association.

Cheney, D. and Seyfarth, R. 2007. Baboon Metaphysics. The Evolution of the Social Mind. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

Gallagher, S. and Hutto, D. 2008. "Understanding others through primary interaction and narrative practice". In J. Zlatev, T. Racine, C. Sinha and E. Itkonen (eds.), The Shared Mind: Perspectives on Intersubjectivity. John Benjamins. pp. 17-38.

Hutto, D. 2008. Folk Psychological Narratives. Cambridge, MIT Press.

Marshall, R., "The Mad Dog Naturalist", Interview with Alexander Rosenberg, 3:AM magazine July 19, 2013.

Satne, G. and Salice, A. 2020. "Shared Intentionality and the Cooperative Evolutionary Hypothesis" in Fiebich, A. Minimal Cooperation and Shared Agency, Springer.

Satne, G. 2016. "A Two-Step Theory of the Evolution of Human Thinking: Joint and (various) Collective Forms of Intentionality", Journal of Social Ontology, Book Symposium on Tomasello's A Natural History of Human Thinking, vol. 2, 1, 105-116.

Satne, G. 2020. "Collective Intentionality, Inferentialism and the Capacity for Claim-Making" in Koreň, L., Schmid, H.B, Stovall, P., Townsend, L. Inferentialism and Collective Intentionality, Springer: Philosophy of Sociality series.