How is Nature Possible?: Kant's Project in the First Critique

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Daniel N. Robinson, How is Nature Possible?: Kant's Project in the First Critique, Continuum, 2012, 216pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441148513.

Reviewed by Jill Vance Buroker, California State University, San Bernardino


The purpose of this book, as described on the back cover, is to clarify "the aims and significance of Kant's project, [locate] its place within the history of philosophy and [identify] the strengths and weaknesses reasonably attributed to this most significant contribution to the history of philosophical reflection." All in 182 pages.

A helpful interpretation of Kant should do a number of things. First, it should have a clear conception of its target audience and their familiarity with Kant. Second, it should treat systematically Kant's method and strategy in the Critique, including the place of each argument in his "architectonic." Third, as background it should explain clearly the views of the philosophers to whom Kant is responding. Fourth, it should take seriously Kant's technical terminology and the positions based on it. And finally, it should demonstrate good familiarity with the Kant literature. This book misses the mark on all counts.

It is not clear what audience this book addresses. In the Preface Robinson says he wants to clarify the Critique for "both generalists and well-prepared students of the text." (ix) Although he is not a Kant specialist, he claims the advantages of "long immersion in the history of ideas," decades of experimental research in visual perception, and "lengthy engagement" with Thomas Reid and Hume. But if well-prepared students have the mastery of Kant's arguments this text presupposes, then it isn't clear why they would want to read it. I also suspect generalists (read intellectual historians?) would become terribly frustrated with the breezy, unsystematic, and inaccurate treatment of Kant.

The easiest way to demonstrate the unsystematic treatment of Kant (a philosopher for whom system is crucial) is to list the chapter titles. After two chapters on "Preliminaries" and "The Larger Context: Germany and the Enlightenment," the author discusses Kant's views in this order: "The Possibility of Metaphysics" (chapter 3), "The Pure Intuitions and the Analogies of Experience" (chapter 4), "Idealisms and Their Refutation" (chapter 5), "Concepts" (chapter 6), "Judgment" (chapter 7), "Whose Experience? The Self and Outer Sense" (chapter 8), and "The Discipline of Reason: Paralogisms, Antinomies, and Freedom" (chapter 9). To be fair, the last chapter rightly appears last, but the order of the others is bizarre. Sure, the Analogies presuppose Kant's theory of pure intuition, but they are pure principles of the understanding, which depend most directly on the deduction of the categories. And of course you cannot explain Kant's view of concepts without explaining his theory of judgment because Kant defines concepts as general representations that function as predicates of possible judgment (A68-9/B93). Even the chapter on judgment fails to explain that for Kant judgment has priority over concept in the order of explanation, and why this is a radical shift from traditional views. In addition, Robinson never spells out the distinction between intuition and concept. Moreover, chapter 8 on the Self and Outer Sense rehashes Kant's argument in the Refutation of Idealism, the ostensible topic of chapter 5.

Not only is the treatment of Kant unsystematic, it is full of errors -- so many that I only can touch on the most egregious. First, rather than explaining background views, Robinson merely lists names. Here are the people mentioned, in order, from pages 10-19 of chapter 2 on the Enlightenment: Descartes, Newton, Galileo, Aristotle, Philipp Jakob Spener, Johann Arndt, King Frederick William I, Luther, Christian Thomasius, Jakob Thomasius, Grotius, Pufendorf, Cicero, Aquinas, Frederick III, Wolff, Leibniz, Frederick the Great, Locke, Alexander Baumgarten, Martin Knutzen, Hamann, Hume, Herder, Goethe, Reid, Oswald, and Beattie. Mixed in on these same pages is a mish-mash of topics: Aristotle's physics and the 17th-century reaction to it, Pietism, Lutheran theology, natural law theory, the installation of philosophy as an academic discipline, Schulphilosophie, Wolff as the founder of Leibnizianism, traditional rationalism, absolute vs. relational theories of space, pre-established harmony, Baumgarten's Psychology, solipsism, Sturm und Drang movement, the development of metaphysics as a science, Kant's entry in the Prussian Royal Academy of Sciences Prize Competition, Popularphilosophie, the Scottish school, and Descartes' method of analysis. You get the picture.

A second source of error is a lack of sensitivity to Kant's technical vocabulary. Often Robinson mentions Kant's technical terms well before attempting any definition, including 'phenomena vs. noumena,' 'intuition,' 'pure,' 'inner sense,' 'synthetic a priori judgment,' 'the powers of sense, understanding and reason,' and 'appearance' among others. The terms 'synthesis' and 'thing in itself' do not appear in the index or the text itself as far as I can see. The author says Kant believes space and time are 'subjective' without distinguishing between individual and species subjectivity. Terms only casually mentioned late in the game include 'representation,' 'transcendental realism' and 'empirical idealism.' Where it is mentioned, empirical realism is not explained. Thus no reader could hope to understand transcendental idealism and how Kant argues for it.

Third, when explanations are offered they are imprecise and unhelpful. For example, on p. 45 Robinson says "the distinction between analytic and synthetic judgments is pivotal to . . . the Critique." There follows no account of the distinction but rather three "interrelated points" raised by the possibility of synthetic a priori judgments. The next two pages detail the controversies over this (unexplained) distinction during Kant's time and more recently involving Kripke and Quine, with the difference between the "a priori and that which depends on one or another empirical mode of confirmation" thrown in for good measure. Later Robinson mentions the "concept containment" criterion, without illustrating clear contrasts, or giving an analysis that applies beyond subject-predicate judgments.

Fourth, Robinson makes claims that are flat out false. Consider the relation between categories and the forms of judgment. On pages 116-7 he describes pure concepts of the understanding (alternatively referred to as pure categories of the understanding) as "aloof to facts as such, and designed to regulate the very form of thought." He says that in introducing pure concepts of understanding, Kant "finds no help from formal logic." But then on page 130 he contradicts himself, stating "Kant accepts the traditional (Aristotelian) classification of logical judgments, but then uses these to derive a corresponding table of pure concepts." Then follow the two tables from the Metaphysical Deduction, without any explanation of what Kant means by a logical form of judgment. Nowhere does Robinson explain the role of the Metaphysical Deduction and its relation to the Transcendental Deduction. If I seem to be carping, consider that the phrase "pure categories of the understanding" implies that there are empirical categories of the understanding. But of course there aren't. In fact, Robinson never even mentions empirical concepts in the text.

I'll end with two more examples of serious confusions. In chapter 6 on concepts, Robinson says: "Kant's approach unfolds through a series of steps from sensations to appearances to concepts and then to one's own concepts." (p. 24) This appears to characterize the sequence of Kant's analysis, his "approach." But then the following sentence apparently describes the perceptual process itself:

The process begins with sensation, a response, or reaction of sensory organs to stimulation. Then, by way of the pure intuitions of time and space, sensations are transformed into appearances. Only when these are subsumed under the pure categories of the understanding is there an experience of what is present in the external world.

So which process is he discussing? It is just false that Kant thinks cognition depends on the temporal sequence expressed in the latter quote (when do we have sensations not arrayed in space and time?). As far as the former quote is concerned, that sequence does not come close to characterizing the stages of Kant's defense of the categories and pure principles.

Finally, Robinson apparently misunderstands Kant's view of metaphysics. Notwithstanding the titles of the Prolegomena to any Future Metaphysics and the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, Robinson says the Transcendental Dialectic leaves no doubt that "Synthetic a priori propositions in metaphysics are not possible at all, for 'Concepts without intuitions are empty' (A52/B76)." (p. 168) Aside from the non sequitur, does this mean the principles of substance and causality in the First and Second Analogies are not metaphysical principles? I always thought that Kant views the pure principles of the understanding as "metaphysical" because they represent necessary truths about objects given in experience. Aren't the principles of physics defended in the MFNS more precise physical versions of these metaphysical principles? Perhaps Robinson associates metaphysics with rationalist principles claimed to provide knowledge of things in themselves. But no careful reader of Kant could assume that. In fact, Kant argues that some traditional metaphysical principles (e.g., substance and causality) are necessary truths about objects of experience, while others (e.g., the existence of God and the soul as simple substance) are illegitimate claims to knowledge.

This book should not have been published because it adds nothing to the literature. It is difficult to imagine a Kant specialist recommending its publication.