How Literature Changes the Way We Think

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Michael Mack, How Literature Changes the Way We Think, Continuum, 2012, 194pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441119148.

Reviewed by Anders Pettersson, Umeå University, Sweden


Michael Mack maintains that we are accustomed to thinking of literature as mimetic, as a representation of reality such as it exists, while literature is in fact, according to him, a disruptive force, breaking up our fictions about the world we live in and showing us new possibilities for the future. For example, literature has the capacity to change our thinking about ageing by undermining the opposition between birth and ageing.

As an introduction to the main themes of Mack's book, let me quote him directly:

How Literature Changes the Way we Think attempts to illuminate literature's ethics of resilience by re-conceptualising our understanding of representation. Literature not only represents to us our world but it also shows us ways in which we can change the world or adapt to changes which have already taken place without our realization. Literature's cognitive dimension helps us cope with the current as well as future challenges by changing the way we think about ourselves, our society and those who are excluded from or marginalized within our society. . . . The literary discussion of the book attends to the ways in which contemporary novels (by Philip Roth and Kazuo Ishiguro amongst others) question the traditional opposition between birth (youth) and aging. By rendering these seemingly oppositional terms, complimentary literature changes the way we think about the demographic challenges our society increasingly faces. (p. 11) [Note that 'we' in the title of the book should be 'We', and "By rendering these seemingly oppositional terms, complimentary" should read "By rendering these seemingly oppositional terms complementary,"; misprints are not infrequent in the book].

Apart from the literary discussion to which Mack refers, his demonstration also proceeds via reflections on earlier thinkers whose reasoning can be related to the central argument, whether positively or negatively. The book contains seven chapters, and discussions of Spinoza, Arendt, Heidegger, de Man, Foucault, Žižek, and, particularly, Walter Benjamin figure prominently. Among examples from literature and the arts not only Roth and Ishiguro come in for consideration, but also, for example, Doctorow, Hölderlin, Celan, and the television series Mad Men. In this brief review I will not enter into Mack's wide-ranging discussions of philosophical and literary authors or of Mad Men. I will concentrate on the theses that are, according to Mack's own presentation just quoted, at the heart of his book.

Mack is teaching English literature and medical humanities, and the latter specialty no doubt explains his special focus on representations of birth and aging. He has earlier published books and articles on Spinoza and on aspects of German literature and German thinking over the last two centuries; Arendt and Benjamin are thinkers who have occupied him before. Mack does not, however, appear to have worked in literary theory or literary aesthetics, and I think that he radically underestimates how much it takes to say something new and interesting about the cognitive role of literature. I find his pronouncements on that subject sweeping and superficial; they can hardly be said to advance our understanding.

I am surprised to read that we are accustomed to thinking of literature as mimetic. The realistic novel is certainly still a very important genre, but that is not enough to justify Mack's claim (which, like many of his claims, comes without supporting evidence). Literature may have been primarily thought of as mimetic up until the nineteenth century, but then the focus largely shifted to regarding literature as expressive of its author's states of mind. Later, from the early twentieth century onwards, formal aspects of literature have been much in the foreground. Furthermore, even those who particularly stress the mimetic dimension of literature -- and the mimetic dimension is of course an undeniable aspect of literature, since literature is obviously a representational art -- do not understand literary representation as a copying of reality. It is thus not an original thought that we can derive ideas from literature about how we could or should live. In the orthodox Marxist tradition it was always, from Marx and Engels up to Socialist Realism, a central tenet that the literary representation of reality should not simply reproduce reality as it is but pay special attention to future-oriented tendencies. Nor has the idea that literature can change the way we think been alien to analytical philosophy of literature or mainstream literary studies; it is referred to, among many other functions of literature, in countless books and articles.

What is being debated when the cognitive role of literature is scrutinized theoretically -- which happens most of all in analytical literary aesthetics -- is the question of how literature can "say" something about reality. Can fictional literature convey statements, and if so, how? If the statements are really in the work, why is not then the literary work as such superfluous from a cognitive point of view: why can we not satisfy ourselves with having the statements and leaving the rest aside? There is a comprehensive specialized literature about issues like these, a literature ignored in Mack´s book. A defensible reconceptualization of literary representation will certainly have to take account of current specialist thought in the area, and it will have to engage closely and analytically with how literary texts function: with how linguistic representations work in general, and with the differentia specifica of literary representations and transactions.

There are, in addition, good reasons to be skeptical of generalizations about what literature does. "Literature" is a vague concept, and if you understand it broadly even an incoherent concept. Mack does not comment on the concept, but treats its content as if it were de facto unproblematic. Apparently, however, he is referring to modern high-quality fiction, drama, and poetry when speaking about literature. I do believe that you can make meaningful general observations about literature, taken in that sense, but modern high-quality fiction, drama, and poetry can assume many forms and cater to many different kinds of interest and need. Generalization about the effects of literature very easily becomes overgeneralization. Mack is certain that "literature critiques fiction" (p. 68; that is, that literature criticizes ideological distortions of reality) and connects us with "the unpredictability and inconsistency of our human condition" (ibid.). In one sense that is to say very little, for it would be problematic to evaluate literary texts highly (and other kinds of text too, for that matter) if they contained ideological distortions of reality or portrayed the human condition as perennially solid and safe. Understood in a more ambitious sense, however, as a kind of specification of what literature is about, Mack's generalization seems less convincing to me. It is true that modern high-quality fiction, drama, and poetry is sometimes focused on critiquing ideological distortions or connecting us with the uncertainty of our condition, but other such literature can seem more directed at simply making us think about ourselves and the social and natural world in which we live, or entertaining us, or fascinating us with new takes on familiar matters and with its inventive way of approaching reality, or other such things.

In his title, How Literature Changes the Way We Think, and in passages like the one quoted initially, Mack presupposes that literature does change the way we think. But does it? How do we know? That is a problem which Mack ignores. There are empirical investigations into the question of whether reading literature does affect our beliefs (by, for example, Richard J. Gerrig, Jèmeljan Hakemulder, and Melanie C. Green and Timothy C. Brock), investigations that Mack does not mention. As I understand them, those investigations demonstrate that literature does have the capacity to affect our beliefs, but not that its capacity in this respect is any bigger than that of non-fiction texts or that the effects are more than transitory. I do not say that literature's cognitive effects are negligible or uninteresting or non-unique, far from it. I do maintain that the question of literature's cognitive effects is highly complex and that Mack has made no real efforts to charter that complexity. His optimistic claims on literature's behalf are just apodictic.

What, then, of birth and aging, the categories at the center of Mack's attention? Is it true that contemporary novels (by Roth and Ishiguro and others) question the traditional opposition between birth (youth) and aging and render these "seemingly oppositional" terms complementary? Well, at least Mack questions that opposition. He writes (p. 26): "As we have seen in this chapter, aging requires change. We start to age from the moment we are born. So the representational or standard opposition between aging and birth is actually fictitious." We are offered no evidence for the surprising idea that there is a standard opposition between aging and birth. The standard opposite of birth is, I suppose, death, or possibly non-birth, but it is certainly not aging. I doubt that there is a standard opposite of aging at all, but if there is, it could perhaps be not-aging, or possibly getting younger, but it can certainly not be birth. And although we no doubt start to age from the moment we are born, I fail to see how that obvious fact can make any standard oppositions in this area fictitious.

Mack comes back to the distinction between birth and aging, under partly new designations, later in his book, with equally confusing results. "One of the tasks of this book", he writes on p. 34, "is to render the oppositions between youth and age inoperable. The harm done by some representations is their production of static and mutually exclusive stereotypes." I do not doubt the existence of age stereotyping or the benefits of getting rid of such clichés, and we probably all agree that the distinction between young and old is not sharp and absolute. But how could it be made "inoperable"? Is there really no valid distinction to be made here? (And what, if anything, is the opposite of "age"? Certainly not "youth", which is, rather, the opposite of "old age".)