Debating Gun Control: How Much Regulation Do We Need?

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David DeGrazia and Lester Hunt, Debating Gun Control: How Much Regulation Do We Need? Oxford University Press, 2016, 290pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190251260.

Reviewed by Firmin DeBrabander, Maryland Institute College of Art


Few topics in US politics are as divisive as the debate over gun rights. We are living at a high tide in the gun rights movement; never has it been so politically dominant. Twenty years ago, the chief gun lobby, the National Rifle Association (NRA), agreed to modest gun control measures, such as universal background checks.[1] No longer. Now the NRA pushes for Permitless Carry, legal in 11 states, whereby gun owners can carry their guns in public without a permit -- and no safety training.[2] Since 2006, gun rights advocates have prodded 11 states to legalize Campus Carry, which allows people to carry guns on public university campuses[3]; and since 2006, they have persuaded 23 states to enact Stand your Ground laws, which say gun owners no longer have a duty to retreat before perceived threats, but may now 'stand their ground' and shoot first. The recent ascendancy of lax gun laws has been accompanied by a rise in mass shootings[4], and a succession of massacres so horrific, their names will go down in US history: Virginia Tech, Aurora, Sandy Hook, Orlando, Las Vegas, Sutherland Springs . . . Among the industrial democracies of the world, America stands out for its robust gun culture -- and gun violence epidemic. There was something singularly odd, if not outrageous, when President Trump declared, after the church massacre in Sutherland Springs, Texas, that nothing could be done to stop mass shootings. He uttered these words during a press conference in Japan -- which rarely exceeds 10 gun deaths per year, while we hover around 30,000.[5] Clearly, Japan has figured something out that we have not -- or that we don't want to.

The gun debate is illuminating about American society and culture, and our brand of democracy. It is a morally charged issue, with dramatic recriminations issued from both sides. Accordingly, it is a topic worthy of philosophical analysis and critique, which, until recently, has been wanting. Here, Lester Hunt and David DeGrazia have put together a concise, readable and helpful book for understanding the moral contours of the gun rights debate. As they put it, they aim to weigh in on "the shape of morally defensible, or morally responsible, gun policy." (xiii)

The first part of the book is devoted to Hunt's arguments against gun control. He opens by specifying what he means by gun control: it is the effort, rallied by cries that "there are too many guns out there," to restrict "the availability of guns." (6) Laws that prohibit violent offenders or children from owning guns, as well as safety regulations pertaining to guns, do not amount to gun control, in Hunt's view, because they "do not make guns less widely available." (7) This is a surprising, if fortuitous definition. It indicates that, though Hunt represents the opposition to gun control, he will be on board with measures that the self-described gun control movement supports, like universal background checks and safe storage laws.

Hunt announces that the core of his argument against gun control, or 'restrictionism' as he puts it, is rights based. The US Supreme Court has acknowledged a "lethal self-defense right." (26) To consider the moral foundation and justification of this right, Hunt looks to John Locke. This lethal self-defense right fits with the particular strain of social contract theory that inspired our nation's founders, he believes. "Locke saw quite vividly the difference between the private function of defense and the public ones of punishment and deterrence," Hunt writes. (30) The state takes over the latter obligations, but leaves citizens the ultimate right of self-defense when and where necessary -- if, as Locke puts it, no appeal can be made to a common judge. Like other gun rights advocates who invoke Locke's intellectual support, Hunt cites the passage from the Second Treatise where Locke says that I may kill a thief when a common judge is absent, because I do not know the thief's intentions and may assume the worst; a thief effectively returns us momentarily to a state of nature again, i.e., a state of war, and I may use lethal force in self-defense.[6]

I find it odd that gun rights advocates cite this passage, and more generally Locke, as support, since it is clear from the Second Treatise as a whole that Locke would be no ally of the gun rights movement and its radical agenda. Locke's example of the thief evokes his argument for why we should strive to leave a state of nature in the first place, and enter civil society: when human individuals with limited knowledge, who are prone to error and bias, issue executive judgments -- like killing a thief because I suspect he might want to kill me -- they are often mistaken, in which case they invite revenge, spark cycles of violence, and ultimately end in a state of war. Killing a thief is nothing to celebrate or take comfort in, but is a tragedy -- which should be prevented whenever possible. Instead, the gun rights movement is busy emboldening gun owners to make such executive judgments, as with Stand your Ground laws, which are a logical extension of expansive gun rights: why have all these guns, and why carry them in public, if I am not also empowered to use them more freely? That is precisely what Stand your Ground laws do, which allow gun owners to shoot people they merely -- and often wrongly -- perceive as mortal threats.[7] This poses a threat to rule of law, the real backbone of peace and order in society. Now I must fear that anyone might view me as a threat -- and if they in turn threaten me, I am free to shoot. This law hastens us towards a state of nature, from which Locke hoped to deliver us. He would favor circumscribing the lethal right of self-defense. Instead of allowing citizens to stand their ground against perceived threats and shoot, the obligation to retreat must be emphasized.

Since we have a right to self-defense, Hunt asks, how is it related to a right to gun ownership? The latter seems a secondary right at best, and hardly essential or foundational. Besides, aren't there other ways to defend yourself? Hunt frames the discussion in terms of option-rights and means-rights. Self-defense is an option right. I may defend myself when in danger -- but how? How shall I or can I carry out this right to self-defense in a way that makes it a reality? Handguns, Hunt argues, are effective means "for the purpose of exercising that option right" of self-defense. (50) Thus, the right to own a gun is a means-right necessarily implied by the right to self-defense. "There are other, more ancient means of self-defense," Hunt explains,

such as skilled use of various pointed or sharp-edged weapons, or hand to hand martial arts . . . but it is common knowledge that, while such methods are effective in various circumstances, they require years of study and, in many cases, innate talent or physical strength. Handguns, on the other hand, are effective in an enormous variety of situations. (53)

Guns are the most universally and practically effective means by which the right of self-defense is empowered, Hunt means to say.

It strikes me, however, that this argument only really pertains to our society, flooded as it is with guns and plagued by loose gun laws. Because there are about 265 million privately owned guns in America,[8] and the NRA keeps open the private sale loophole that allows criminals to freely purchase guns -- and encourages gun owners to shoot mere threats -- yes, a handgun may indeed be necessary for self-defense in this environment. But Japan has proven that you can create a very different environment: in Japan, where guns are a rare sight, and threat, it is hard to make the case one needs a gun for self-defense. We could, of course, change the conditions for reasonable and practical self-defense in America; instead, we are busy creating the conditions where guns are necessary for daily security, or a sense thereof.

Hunt issues a general critique of gun safety proponents, or those who assail the danger of widespread gun ownership, especially the medical community. He admits it is not hard to see why medical professionals tend to see guns negatively and favor restrictionism: they see guns only in terms of the harm they do. They see guns deterministically: guns are tools with bad effects. But this is to ignore how guns can be viewed voluntaristically, as gun rights proponents do. "Unlike the deterministic model of guns, which was crafted mainly by modern intellectuals," Hunt writes, "the voluntaristic one is embedded in American culture . . . [The] concepts central to this model and the cultural metaphors that embody it include above all that of individual choice, as well as . . . responsibility and moral character." (96-97) Guns make people feel like responsible individuals, self-reliant for their security. Self-reliance is an eminently American virtue, rooted in our cultural heritage and experience, evoked by our myths -- and, Hunt says, "thinking rooted in myth is not necessarily irrational." (97) But while the aspiration represented by gun ownership might not be irrational -- the aspiration to be autonomous and secure -- guns are not an effective or credible means for achieving it. They are at best an illusory means of achieving autonomy; at worst, to borrow a phrase from DeGrazia, they are self-defeating. On the whole, DeGrazia points out, the current state of gun ownership does not offer people more control over their security. To the contrary, it is making gun owners' lives, on the whole, more endangered.

Hunt concludes by laying out policy recommendations implied or allowed by his arguments: "background checks for relevant criminal convictions," "licensing, with perhaps a safety course requirement," and "laws that require a before-purchase waiting period or some safe storage requirement" to help diminish the number of suicides. (109) Gun control advocates would be thrilled to see any or all of these recommendations enacted. As DeGrazia shows, we do not have even the most basic regulations in place to combat the number of gun deaths in America. We do not have background checks on all gun transactions, for example. As for those states lining up to enact Permitless Carry, how does it promote the cause of responsible gun ownership when safety training is no longer required?  In general, Hunt says, he wants "legislation that goes after the problem segment [of gun owners] and leaves the vast majority of rational and decent people in peace." (113) I agree -- but Hunt neglects to discuss how the gun lobby has ensured that the federal agency charged with stemming the flow of illegal guns to criminals, and tracking down errant gun dealers -- the ATF, or Bureau of Alcohol, Tobacco and Firearms -- is financially strapped, legislatively hamstrung, and powerless to do its job.[9] The ATF is one of the most significant casualties in our gun epidemic -- ensuring that our gun culture reaches epidemic proportions. I sense an analogy to Hunt's option-right, means-right argument: if we are going to have gun control laws, like background checks that would keep guns away from dangerous individuals, then we require effective means to make them a reality -- such as a fully empowered ATF, and background checks for all gun transactions.

In the second half of the book, DeGrazia examines the Argument from Physical Security, as it pertains to guns. He asks, "Does the option of owning firearms enable more adequate self-defense and physical security than would be possible if this option were unavailable?" (157) After considering the evidence, DeGrazia concludes, the answer is 'no.' If people own guns to gain greater security, the effort appears to be self-defeating. DeGrazia cites numerous studies in this regard: "having a gun at home increases one's likelihood of dying by suicide;" "the risk of death by homicide is considerably greater in homes with guns than in homes without guns." (158) Though gun ownership on the whole looks self-defeating, DeGrazia admits there are people for whom it may not be. Their safety can be enhanced by gun ownership. But this is not the case, apparently, for the population as a whole. The Argument for Physical Safety "is more plausible," DeGrazia convincingly claims, "if we restrict the scope of those who have the moral right [to gun ownership] much more narrowly than the set of all competent adults." (167) In other words, to enhance the life-protecting attributes of gun ownership, we ought to insist on stricter gun control regulations. In particular, we must limit gun ownership to those individuals who demonstrate that they need guns for self-defense, and can be careful, responsible gun owners, and we must mandate that they store their guns safely in the home.

This is part of the consequentialist case for gun control, DeGrazia says. States and countries with low gun ownership rates and strong gun control measures -- where, for example, gun ownership is restricted based on need and demonstrated responsibility -- have lower gun fatality rates than do states and countries with high gun ownership rates and loose gun control laws. (197) The data are unequivocal about this. On consequentialist grounds alone, stronger gun control is hard to dispute, which is why gun rights proponents undermine, question, and ultimately block public health studies that prove gun ownership to be self-defeating, and also insist on another type of argument for gun ownership altogether, namely, a rights-based argument. Luckily, DeGrazia believes he can make the case for gun control in this regard, too.

When considering the gun debate, DeGrazia claims, there is another relevant right beyond the right to bear arms: the right not to be shot. This is perhaps strange sounding, but he claims it "is a plausible specification of rights not to be killed or grievously injured -- in contexts in which firearms are available." (215) And "one of the chief legitimating purposes of a state -- and therefore the government -- is to enforce the law and protect people's rights, so the right not to be shot generates obligations . . . on the part of the government." (215) Gun rights advocates, DeGrazia writes, recognize only the right to bear arms, but "there are two rights, so neither can trump the other. Rather, a responsible delineation of the scope of each right must take the other right into due consideration." (217) Gun rights cannot be loosened so expansively that people's right not to be shot is infringed; likewise, DeGrazia claims, people's right not to be shot does not imply a ban on gun ownership.

DeGrazia makes it clear that our government is not sufficiently protecting our right not to be shot, but is instead overly protective of the right to bear arms. Even modest regulations are dismissed out of hand by our representatives at the behest of the NRA and its passionate supporters. The status quo on guns, DeGrazia argues, is indefensible. To illustrate, he lists a host of abysmal gun safety loopholes and measures, many which have already been mentioned, but also include the availability of weapons and accessories that far exceed the needs of self-defense, such as semi-automatic rifles, high capacity magazine clips, and armor piercing bullets; the absence of consumer safety regulations on guns, though they exist for "automobiles, child seats, toys, bags;" the government's refusal -- again, at the NRA's behest -- to fund public health studies on gun violence; and the effort by some states to "impose legal gag orders on physicians" who wish to discuss with their patients the safe storage of guns. (235) To this impressive list, I might add other reckless policies that the NRA is urging on the states, such as Permitless Carry and Stand your Ground laws, as well as laws, like Campus Carry, allowing people to carry guns in a wider variety of public places.

Unsurprisingly, DeGrazia lays out a more extensive list of recommended gun control policies, including expanding background checks, bolstering the ATF, government funding for public health research on gun violence, banning weaponry and accessories that exceed the needs of self-defense, removing gag orders on physicians, and regulating guns like other consumer products. I am buoyed by the fact that there is common ground between DeGrazia and Hunt when it comes to policy recommendations. It's a shame that the current political environment is so polarizing, and the gun lobby so unyielding, that it prevents this common ground from being realized, at least for the foreseeable future.

[1] Margaret Hartmann, "NRA used to support background checks, now favors more illogical, unpopular position," New York, January 31, 2013.

[2] Katie Zezima, "More states are allowing people to carry concealed guns without a permit," Washington Post, February 24, 2017.

[3] Neal H. Hutchens and Kerry B. Melear, "More states are allowing guns on college campuses," Business Insider, August 18, 2017.

[4] Carl Bialik, Andrew Flowers, and Ritchie King, "Mass shootings have become more common in the U.S.," FiveThiryEight, December 2, 2015.

[5] Chris Weller, "How Japan has almost completely eliminated gun deaths," Business Insider, November 6, 2017.

[6] John Locke, Second Treatise on Government (Cambridge University Press, 1988), section 19.

[8] Lois Beckett, "Gun inequality: US study charts rise of hardcore super owners," The Guardian, September 19, 2016.

[9] Alan Berlow, "How the NRA hobbled the ATF," Mother Jones, February 11, 2013.