How Philosophy Became Socratic: A Study of Plato's Protagoras, Charmides, and Republic

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Laurence Lampert, How Philosophy Became Socratic: A Study of Plato's Protagoras, Charmides, and Republic, University of Chicago Press, 2010, 441pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226470962.

Reviewed by Zina Giannopoulou, University of California, Irvine


This book proposes a novel thesis: we can trace the temporal development in Socrates' thought by paying attention to the dramatic dates and settings of three Platonic dialogues. Lampert, a prominent Nietzsche scholar, appeals to the familiar distinction between composition dates, which are assigned on the basis of a conception of Plato's development, and dramatic dates, which are internal to the action of the dialogues, and claims that the latter help us to 'reconstruct Plato's account of how Socrates became himself' (2). Socrates lived in a vibrant city at the center of Greek civilization, a city of military, political, and cultural power. Lampert's sensible claim is that by examining Socrates' thought against the background of the history of Athens we may come to appreciate its progression over time, how it became what it was. What interests him is the political aspect of Socratic philosophy, its preoccupation with the 'public appearance of philosophy,' which he dissociates from the 'nonpublic Socrates whose primary concern is the investigation basic to philosophy, of nature and human nature' (8). In his view, Protagoras, Charmides, and Republic display Socrates' public political persona, whereas Phaedo, Parmenides, and Symposium foreground the more intimate issues of 'nature and the possibility of humans coming to know nature' (8). The latter triad of dialogues he promises to discuss in another book, 'the second part of [his] Nietzschean project on Plato' (417), How Socrates Became Socrates.

The current book reads like a detailed commentary of the dialogues under examination, although the treatment of Republic is relatively brief. While this format enables Lampert to delve into the intricacies of his material, it often eclipses the main thesis. Many of his discussions contain lengthy summaries and arguments that are fairly uncontroversial, whereas the novelty of the project, the thematic interlinking of the dialogues and its interpretative ramifications, is fitfully displayed. Chapter 1 is a study of Protagoras, a dialogue that Lampert places in 433 BCE and deems the chronologically first of Plato's works from the point of view of its dramatic setting. He maintains that in it Socrates 'mounts the public stage' (9) and seeks to win a reputation for himself as the first man ever to defeat the sophist Protagoras. Protagoras is thus seen as a public defense of Socratic philosophy: by placing the dialogue at the high point of Periclean democracy and by having Socrates challenge Protagoras on the teachability of virtue, Plato invites us to see how Socrates differs from his sophistic adversary. Whereas Protagoras' epideixis absolves the Athenian leaders of incompetence or irresponsibility in rearing their youth by praising Athenian education and all the citizens as participants in it, Socrates shows that only the experts can teach virtue and that 'teachable virtue can reform Athenian practice' (116). He thus teaches Protagoras, and by extension the sophists, how to sell themselves: 'By peddling a certain kind of gnosticism, Socrates redirects the Protagorean enlightenment. He, a private investigator, sells the salesmen of knowledge a better way to sell themselves, better by knowing its buyers' (116). Toward the end of the chapter, Lampert claims that Protagoras is dramatically succeeded by Alcibiades I and that the two dialogues are thematically interconnected: in the public setting of the former dialogue Socrates questions whether political virtue is teachable, and in the private setting of the latter dialogue he sets out to teach Alcibiades political virtue.

Charmides, which is the focus of Chapter 2, is set in late May 429 BCE, on the day after Socrates' return to Athens from Potidaea. Whereas the overt topic of the dialogue is sôphrosynê ('moderation' or 'sound-mindedness'), the covert topic is Socrates' intention to discover how philosophy fared during his absence. Socrates realizes that Critias, one of his prewar associates and a silent character in Protagoras, 'turned philosophy into an instrument that justified and advanced his own passion to rule' (10) and 'view[ed] tyranny as the best life' (276). Critias' abuse of Socrates' lessons shows to his teacher that 'things stand badly with philosophy, with his philosophy, if Critias is exemplary of how those who heard him before Potidaea received it' (139; emphasis original). In his pre-Potidaean years, then, Socrates failed to educate Critias, but the Socrates who returns from Potidaea brings with him a new teaching about the soul from a doctor of the god Zalmoxis, which remains hidden in Charmides. This new teaching is 'deadly for Critias,' and 'its transmission requires that it be sheltered within a covering that will make it accessible only to those for whom it can be liberating' (233). Esotericism seems inevitable, until we get to Republic.

In that dialogue, the subject matter of Chapter 3, Socrates will voice the Thracian incantations that he advertized in Charmides. Set in early June 429 BCE, Republic is deemed a kind of sequel not only to Charmides but also to Protagoras, as it repeats 'on a grander scale all the themes of Protagoras' and contains a 'far more radical defense of philosophy than the one [given] in Protagoras' (11). Socrates' aim in Republic is to 'shelter the city from philosophy while sheltering philosophy from the city' (242) by introducing a new, post-Homeric teaching on god and the soul. Socrates emerges as 'a radical innovator in philosophy who makes philosophy itself the source of proofs for new teachings on god, soul, and the moral order of the cosmos' (277). The dramatic dates of these dialogues suggest that Socrates changed over the course of the four years that span them and eventually became 'who he was'. The measures that the pre-war Socrates of Protagoras takes for the protection and advancement of philosophy are 'half-measures' and need to be supplanted by the more adequate measures of Republic, while Charmides serves as a bridge between these two dialogues, an urgent call to unimpeded philosophical action. Thus, for example, to the extent that Glaucon's ambitions mirror those of Critias, Republic picks up some of the preoccupations of Charmides, but to the extent that Glaucon's political future must be different from that of his mother's cousin, it also advances and deepens the problematic of the earlier dialogue.

Perhaps the most original aspect of Lampert's study is its intertextuality: it brings together three dialogues which are traditionally taken to belong to different phases of Plato's development and links them chronologically and thematically. Although the significance of the dramatic dating of the Platonic dialogues has been noted more often than the author concedes, it has seldom been made central to a book's thesis; thus the vision of Lampert's project is both fresh and praiseworthy. But has he served it successfully? Here are four quibbles by way of response. First, I am not sure that the distinctively unifying theme of his material is that it reveals 'the public appearance of philosophy.' Can we really say that Protagoras, Charmides, and Republic are more concerned with the public face of philosophy than, say, Apology, Crito, or Gorgias? Apology is even conducted in a public setting where Socrates expatiates on the political repercussions of his elenctic mission in the company of people who wield political power; it is thus, arguably, the most overtly political of all Plato's dialogues. But aren't many, if not most, of the dialogues to some extent political, dealing as they do with issues of public consequence even when they are rooted in queries about the lives of specific individuals? If so, Lampert's thematic criterion for grouping together Protagoras, Charmides, and Republic appears arbitrary and reductive, suppressing the significant differences among these dialogues in the name of a forced unity.

Second, Lampert claims that Socrates' pre-Potidean philosophizing, which is made manifest in Protagoras, is different from his post-Potidean teaching, as evident in Republic. Echoing Leo Strauss, he asserts that the Socratic 'esotericism' of Protagoras -- 'salutary opinions sheltering less than salutary truths' -- is 'inescapable' (14-5), but he never accounts for this inescapability. He says that Socrates' esotericism responds to Protagoras' 'flawed,' 'fearful,' and 'ineffective' esotericism by 'inventing salutary tales about the famous wise while recommending laconic brevity' (97-8). The latter part of this statement may be true, but it does not explain why Socrates agrees to converse with Protagoras by adopting the latter's modus operandi in the first place. Why is he not forthcoming with his teachings in 433 BCE? How do the historical times, references to which crop up frequently in the book, affect Socrates' philosophical rhetoric? Lampert stresses 'philosophy's essential esotericism' (133) and claims that for Socrates 'philosophy itself … can only be solitary and private' (131). But then what are we to make of the dialectical nature of Socrates' philosophizing? One may also question the presence of Socratic esotericism in Protagoras (or in any dialogue, for that matter): is Socrates reticent about his views on hedonism or the unity of the virtues? What is he withholding?

Third, Lampert's claim that 'Charmides introduces the Republic' (241) takes its cue from Critias' failure to make correct use of Socrates' teachings. One wonders why Critias heard 'in Socrates' words an … invitation that set him on the path to the tyrannical life' (277). Who is to blame for his corruption? Lampert suggests that Socrates is responsible, as when he says, for example, that 'Charmides showed Socrates … that his way of sharing his philosophy turned a gifted follower into a self-serving predator' (292), but this seems a little rash. Does the psychic disposition of Socrates' interlocutors have no effect on their ethical choices? If not, Socrates could be deemed responsible for his associates' moral conduct, but this runs against Apology 33b4-5. Lampert's suggestion all but corroborates the accusation that Socrates corrupted the Athenian youth. Things take a stranger turn when Critias' failure is thought to make Socrates realize that his young interlocutors need to be invited not to 'philosophy' but to 'morality,' which Lampert sometimes associates with Socrates' introduction of a new religion to Athens. Here is what he says in this regard:

Nothing can be done with Critias; he's firmly set on his path. But Glaucon and Adeimantus stand at the beginning of their choice of a life already tainted by schooled disillusion with what their decency makes them want most to believe. No longer can Socrates responsibly teach them the beginnings of disbelief in Delphi, as he did Critias, those first steps in self-knowledge meant to lead to philosophy as a way of life. The sophistic critique of religion and the misuse of religion by the religious compel Socrates to undertake the very different task of restoring faith in religion. He now knows what the returned Odysseus learned: "his destiny is to establish belief and not knowledge" (277).

The distinction here is between Socrates' lesson about self-knowledge and the philosophical life in Charmides, and his 'responsible' attempt to foster religious faith through knowledge in Republic. I find this dichotomy odd and unpersuasive. Philosophy and morality are inextricably connected in Plato, the former enabling, justifying, and enhancing the latter.

Finally, Lampert never really offers a precise account of how Socrates becomes who he is over the course of the three dialogues that he examines. His discussion, though sensitive to nuance and textual detail, often proceeds by indirection and suggestion when one longs for a systematic exposition. What is essentially Socratic about Republic that is missing from Protagoras? Does Socrates really change, in the sense that he progressively acquires characteristics that are typically associated with him and which he lacked at the beginning of his philosophical journey? If so, what precisely are they and how did he come to possess them? Or could it be that he remains the same but reveals himself in degrees or in different ways, for pedagogical or other purposes? Does it even make sense to choose one of these alternatives if Socrates is, as some contend, a plastic character, a figure that Plato moulds in accordance with his needs? Socrates' indeterminacy as a Platonic character has been hotly debated for a while now, and I would have liked to know Lampert's position on this issue and how he thinks it could affect his interpretation.

Despite these criticisms, this is a stimulating and thought-provoking book. Even if one disagrees with the author's interpretative stance or philosophical positions, one cannot but be impressed by the freshness of his thinking. Scattered throughout are suggestions and thoughts that make the reader ponder matters anew. One of the most interesting -- and most literary -- of them is Lampert's likening of Socrates who returns to Athens from Potidaea to Homer's Odysseus who comes back to Ithaca: both men return to their native lands having accumulated wisdom and eager to undertake a political project of restoration and growth. The numerous and ingenious connections that Lampert draws among Charmides, Republic, and Odyssey weave a rich, secondary intertextual tapestry that runs parallel to the primary one. A third, albeit less rich, intertextual tapestry is woven out of conceptual threads that pertain to Charmides, Republic, and Nietzsche's philosophy. Here is a representative excerpt:

Nietzsche could speak openly about the rule of the philosopher as legislator and physician and aim to embody it himself; Plato could speak about that only covertly while showing Socrates in action as its embodiment. Nietzsche could state that Socrates was "the one turning point and vortex of so-called world history"; Plato could only intimate that Socrates aimed at that as a philosopher who descended to rule, but by writing it he could make that aim his own (225).

The book teems with passages such as this one, where erudition blends with readerly sensitivity and imagination; the rewards that it offers to scholars and students of Plato are ample.