How Physics Makes Us Free

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J. T. Ismael, How Physics Makes Us Free, Oxford University Press, 2016, 273pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190269449.

Reviewed by Carl Hoefer, Universitat de Barcelona/ICREA


Jenann Ismael's book is a strikingly original monograph that somehow manages to be perfectly relevant and highly engaging to both the intelligent lay reader and the professional philosopher. It shows how well done philosophy of science can be relevant for the public at large, even when treating questions that have, of late, suffered from the ravages of analytic metaphysics. The book may be more widely read inside the academy than outside, but those on the outside who read it in full will surely come away with a better opinion of philosophy than they had at the start. Ismael's prose is beautiful, evocative, and full of helpful metaphors and analogies; what is lacking (mostly) are dry pre-packaged philosophical terms, convoluted arguments and hackneyed examples. (For example, though free will is the main topic, Dr. Black, the evil neurosurgeon, is delightfully absent.)

The aim is to show, as the title says, how (and why) the physics of our world -- the facts about the laws of nature, and about ourselves as physical beings -- is fully compatible with our being genuinely free agents, just as we ordinarily believe ourselves to be.

Was our freedom ever in doubt? Yes, of course; and physics and biology have been two of the main sources of anxiety about our ultimate status as agents. The book has two main parts, and in a sense part one addresses the biology (and psychology/cognitive science/brain science) side of things, while part two addresses the apparent threat of physical determinism.

Before we begin exploring Ismael's ideas, a brief digression about physical determinism may be useful. It is commonly thought that the rise of quantum physics in the 20th century established that indeterminism rather than determinism reigns in our world. From the perspective of those who have this belief, it may appear odd that a philosopher of science dedicates a book to arguing that we may consider ourselves to have freedom even if determinism is true. Why bother? Ismael briefly addresses this point early on, noting that it is unclear how quantum randomness at the microscopic level can be transmuted into free will at the level of action, and that in any case it is unclear how the effectively classical laws of the meso- and macroscopic world arise out of the quantum fundamental level. These are correct observations, but even more can be said in defense of the book's project. One of the few coherent ways of understanding ordinary quantum mechanics, Bohmian mechanics, is fully deterministic in the same sense as classical physics. So, despite the fact that Bohmian mechanics does not extend to relativistic quantum fields, we cannot assume, at this point, that our ultimate theory of the fundamental stuff of the world will not turn out to be deterministic. A thorough exploration of how freedom is compatible with underlying physical determinism is therefore still worth having in its own right; and it may turn out that the account carries over without difficulty into a setting in which micro-level indeterminism is present. This is in fact the case with Ismael's account of human freedom.

Part I provides a naturalistic account of our selves: how and why creatures such as us, who have a self-conception, make plans and decide how to act and for what reasons, exist in a physical world containing living organisms but no Cartesian souls. The account is not complete: Ismael makes no attempt to explain how life arose in the first place on Earth, or to solve the "hard problem" of consciousness. What she offers instead is a naturalistically acceptable way of understanding ourselves as the product of billions of years of evolution that have, as it happens, produced living creatures of ever greater complexity. At some point the complexity of self-organizing systems turns into something that can be thought of as self-governing: making plans for the distant future and all-things-considered judgments to regulate action. That is something that we humans can do, with our marvelously complex brains and culture. But the self that does this self-governing is no mysterious, unified and indivisible Cartesian soul-substance[1]; it is a package of abilities and activities that we are coming to understand more and more through work in cognitive neuroscience and other areas of science. The best metaphor with which to replace the Cartesian substance notion, Ismael maintains, is that of a corporation: an entity with many parts working to do many different jobs, in which most important decisions get made by an executive committee that has privileged (but by no means complete or perfect) epistemic access to what is going on in the environment and in itself (the corporation), makes all-things-considered judgments about what actions should be taken, and feeds those decisions back down the channels of communication to the relevant parts of the corporation that, ideally, will put them into practice.

One thing that remains unclear in Ismael's story is exactly what role conscious experience (and, often, self-conscious experience, in humans) plays in the processes of self-governance. A corporation, after all, is not a conscious entity; and consciousness does not figure in the story Ismael sketches of how a corporation, and particularly its executive board, functions. Real executive boards are made up of humans, and they are indeed usually conscious during meetings, but to take their consciousness as part of the story of how the self-governance works would be to push the metaphor too far and ruin it. Homunculi are not to be posited inside the mechanisms of the brain! Ismael acknowledges (p. 76) that the role of consciousness in human thinking and decision-making is still unclear. But this gap in our understanding of ourselves does not threaten the overall rightness of the new image of ourselves as complex physical beings that has emerged from the mind sciences.

The description of a human self that emerges in part one is one that is perfectly naturalistic, and compatible with current science. At least, it should be seen as naturalistic by philosophers who are not worried that structures and entities that are in some sense or other emergent phenomena are either causally impotent or incompatible with true physicalism. Philosophers who do have such worries will find the cure laid out in several stages in part II.

If we are simply physical, biological beings -- complex ones, to be sure, but still in the end just "matter in motion" -- then there are two prima facie threats to our conception of ourselves as agents with freedom of will. First, there is the threat of (physical) causality: the worry that our decisions, being just events in the brain, are fully determined by prior states and events, whose existence causally necessitates or compels the allegedly free decisions to occur. Ismael has a two-pronged response to this apparent threat. First, she argues (in the tradition of Russell and Huw Price) that in nature itself this alleged necessity or compulsion does not really exist. The basic laws of physics say how things behave, but (a) do not ascribe causality or necessitation, and (b) do not even privilege the past to future direction over the future to past direction. But Ismael acknowledges the point hammered on by Nancy Cartwright and many other philosophers post-Russell: independently of physical laws, the notion of cause is ubiquitous and ineliminable from practical science and daily life, where it connects intimately with how we can effectively intervene in the physical world to bring about desired effects. Embracing the new causalism of Judea Pearl, Clark Glymour, James Woodward and others, Ismael turns the threat of causality into the handmaid (and consequence) of freedom. What the causal graphs coming out of science reveal is nothing more than practically useful structural relations in the emergent kinds, properties and entities of our world, relations showing how we can bring about Y by intervening on X. So the causal relations in the physical world are not underminers of our freedom, but rather enablers of it.

The second prima facie threat is the classical "Consequence Argument" that lies at the heart of much of the free will literature. Dispelling this threat is the main goal of part two, and as Ismael notes early in chapter 4, the rest of the book is required to give her full solution.

The Consequence Argument is familiar to most philosophers, but is short and clear so we may as well recite it here. Ismael borrows van Inwagen's (1983) version:

1. Dynamical determinism entails that the facts of the past, in conjunction with the laws of nature, entail every truth about the future.
2. The past is not under our control.
3. Laws of nature are not under our control.
4. Our actions are entailed by the past and laws of nature.


5. Our actions are not under our control.

Granting the validity of the argument, we may naturally ask: which premise (or premises) does Ismael reject, in order to evade the unwelcome conclusion? The short answer to this question is that she denies both 2 and 3. But it is important to add that she also emphasizes that, at least for typical deterministic physical laws (e.g. Newtonian physics), 1 and 4 have time-reverse twins that we need to keep in mind:

1*. Dynamical determinism entails that the facts of the future, in conjunction with the laws of nature, entail every truth about the present and past.
4*. Our actions are entailed by the future and laws of nature.

The (presumed) temporal symmetry of fundamental physical laws is crucial in helping us to shake off the tendency to think of determinism as being all about how past facts force or compel present events to go a certain way and not otherwise. If the logical determination works just the same in the opposite temporal direction, yet we have no intuitive inclination to feel that future events control or compel us, noting this fact may help shake off the grip of the idea that past facts control or compel us.

In addition to the highlighting of the time symmetry of determinism, the following points are the main components of Ismael's defense of freedom:

a. A "Block Universe" perspective on time, i.e. one in which the future is no less real than the present or past;
b. A distinction between global laws that concern the evolution of the whole universe, and local laws specifying how small systems behave if left on their own, or when they interact or combine in certain ways;
c. A Humeanism concerning global laws, which are made true by the full overall pattern of events in the Block (i.e., over all time), and hence should not be seen as pre-existing or eternal necessities that compel physical events at all times;
d. An emergentism or pluralism about explanation, which allows us to see our selves, our deliberations and decisions, as (normally) the right factors to cite in explaining our actions, rather than something going on concurrently at the level of cells, or chemical compounds, or fundamental particles.

The reconciliation of free will with physical determinism that Ismael offers is broadly similar to one that I defended in Hoefer (2002), an obscure paper that Ismael discovered only after doing all the work on her book. The key idea that separates the view from standard compatibilism is this. Once we free ourselves from certain misconceptions about time and physical law, we can correctly regard ourselves as the sources and determiners of our own free actions, and regard both facts toward the past, and toward the future, as influenced or affected by those choices and actions. But there is a great asymmetry in that influence. Our choices and actions normally have clearly visible, macroscopic consequences toward the future, but they "affect" past events, normally, only at an imperceptible microscopic level. The word 'affect' needs scare-quotes here because, toward the past, it is inappropriate to think of our free actions as causing things to happen in such-and-so ways; it is more accurate to say that, under determinism, our free actions place constraints on how past events may be, at a microscopic level. (Namely: they must be such as to be compatible with your action, given the constraints supplied by the deterministic laws.) Here is where it helps to keep in mind the time-symmetry of determinism and the Block Universe perspective in which the past is not ontologically different from, or privileged over, the present or future. Physics does not make us marionettes on "iron rails" of compulsion running from the past through the present and into the future; these (mixed) metaphors in fact have no place in a clear view of what science has taught us about the world. Cause-effect relations do typically run from past to future, but they are not usually deterministic and are emergent regularities which are, moreover, partially perspectival and context-dependent.[2] The upshot is that physics does not force us to view ourselves as helplessly in the grip of the past facts plus physical laws.

So far, the story makes clear that Ismael rejects, in a weak sense at least, premise 2 of the Consequence Argument. But what about premise 3? As I mentioned above, Ismael adopts, in part at least, a Humean perspective on physical laws that allows one to see the laws as partially brought about by our actions, and in that sense under our "control". But the story here is not fully clear to me. In chapter 4, Ismael nicely expresses a residual worry that one might feel about our very choices being logically determined by past facts plus the laws. She then introduces a distinction between 'local laws' that are the hard core of physics and determine how things behave in isolation or in idealized circumstances, and 'global laws' which are "emergent laws that describe the universe as a whole", and are presumably involved in the threat of determinism. The key to rebutting the lingering menace of the Consequence Argument lies in this local/global laws distinction. Ismael writes:

When we adopt a globalist perspective, our activities become part of the pattern of events that make up history. Since our activities partly determine the pattern, and the pattern determines the laws, our activities partly determine the laws. But then something weird happens. We invert the order of determination and reify the laws, so that now it looks like the laws are not simply descriptions of patterns that is partly constituted by our actions but are instead iron rails built into the spatial and temporal landscape that won't let us act in any way not in accord with them. (p. 111)

The Humean perspective on laws is clear here, as is the way that it allows us to reject premise 3 of the Consequence Argument. But I am puzzled about the distinction between local and global laws invoked here, and do not see how it can form part of a plausible response to the threat of determinism.

Consider a simple Newtonian world with mass- and charge-bearing particles moving under Newton's laws plus the gravity laws, and Coulomb's law supplying the forces between charged particles. These are presumably local laws, rather than emergent global laws. But the spectre of Newtonian determinism, to the extent that it exists, arises directly from these local laws plus a stipulation that nothing has been left out of the description of the system.[3] I would not naturally describe this stipulation as being an "emergent global law", but perhaps it is the kind of thing that Ismael has in mind. To be sure, a stipulation that nothing exogenous enters the world and disrupts the course of events may be seen as the kind of truth that does not become a true universal regularity until the end of time. On the other hand, it is also not the kind of regularity that we can see our actions as partly helping to constitute. It's not as though we have the power to conjure up exogenous disruptors, but we all for some reason choose not to exercise that power![4]

Other than such a protection-clause, I am unclear about what sort of facts might be considered global laws in Ismael's sense. Perhaps global conservation laws, or a stipulation that (e.g.) total angular momentum in the world is zero? These are indeed non-local, but in a Newtonian context at least they are derivable from an initial state plus the local laws (again assuming no exogenous disruptions). Nor, I would say, do they intuitively seem like laws with the kind of contingency that the Humean perspective Ismael sketches invites us to ascribe to them.

If one insists that it is more appropriate to see the truth of certain laws as based on contingent patterns of events, patterns which we humans in part constitute with our free actions, this invites us to contemplate a counterfactual assertion like this: "Had Mary chosen (and acted) differently, global law G would not have held." Perhaps this is a kind of assertion Ismael thinks we should endorse. But it is not strictly necessary, in order to respond to the apparent threat of determinism to human freedom. One may instead endorse a backtracking counterfactual: "Had Mary chosen (and acted) differently, certain microscopic features of the past would have been different." Since Ismael already urges us to accept statements like this as part of her account of the right ways to think about the time symmetry of physics and the "openness" of the future, there is no extra cost to going this route, It leaves one free to ascribe as much or as little necessity to the laws of nature as one likes. Or to put it in terms of the Consequence Argument: once we have rendered it unsound by rejecting premise 2, there is no need to reject premise 3 as well.

The last three chapters round out Ismael's defense of human freedom in an engaging and persuasive fashion. Chapter 7, "The Paradox of Predictability", introduces a delightful and paradoxical-seeming scenario in which a Laplace's Demon type of intelligence who knows the initial conditions of the world and the laws can be frustrated. It is possible to set up devices that are wired to do the opposite of whatever they are predicted to do, so to speak. If the demon predicts that the device will do X, the very prediction sets in motion cause-effect chains that lead to the device not doing X. But it is not just simple devices that can do this; we ourselves may act in a "counterpredictive" fashion, if we so choose. So we can thumb our noses at the demon who presumes to know what we will do -- at least, we can do so if he announces to us his prediction.

Chapter 8 tackles the age-old worry of fatalism, the concern -- apparently heightened if we adopt the Block Universe view of the world -- that what will be will be, that the future is "already written". Ismael skillfully deploys the same tools here that she used earlier in defusing the Consequence Argument. Chapter 9, the last regular chapter, returns to the themes of part I and offers an elegant synthesis of Ismael's perspective on human agents and human agency in our purely physical world. The book ends with a very helpful Postscript that recapitulates and further clarifies most of the themes and arguments that ran through the book.

For philosophers, Ismael's book is an outstanding and original contribution to the literature on free will, as well as an excellent contribution to the literature on causation and laws of nature. For everyone, it is a book addressing one of the most serious existential challenges that modern science has provoked, and doing so in a way that somehow manages to be deep and easy to understand in equal measures. It is a book that nobody who cares about how human freedom squares with modern physicalism can afford to ignore.


Hoefer, C. (2002) "Freedom from the Inside Out", in Callender, C. (ed.), Time, Reality and Experience. Cambridge University Press.

van Inwagen, P. (1983) An Essay on Free Will. Clarendon Press.

[1] Chapter 3, "The Unity of the Self", is very philosophically rich -- and correspondingly heavier going for non-academic readers. Ismael points this out to her readers and encourages those who either can't (e.g. because of not having read any Kant) or don't want to delve into these turbid waters to skip ahead to the very helpful "Appendix for the Slackers" that rounds out part I.

[2] Here one sees the influence of Pearl's work on causation, and also Huw Price's; in the Preface Ismael acknowledges how both have shaped her thinking over the years.

[3] As Earman (1986) and subsequent works have demonstrated, there are various ways in which determinism can fail in a Newtonian context, which must therefore be excluded if we are to have a clear case of a deterministic physical system governed by Newtonian (+ Coulomb, say) laws. For example, we must rule out by stipulation any "space invaders" entering the universe "from infinity" and wrecking the determination of future events by the past states plus laws.

[4] It is also not clear that one always needs to stipulate the absence of outside disruptors in order to go from local laws to global determinism. In the context of electromagnetic theory in Minkowski spacetime, for example, the spacetime structure itself rules out space invaders. And any other sort of exogenous disruption we might introduce by hand into the picture would entail a violation of the local Maxwell laws, the sort of laws that Ismael does not invite us to think of as mere Humean regularities.