How Scientific Practices Matter: Reclaiming Philosophical Naturalism

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Rouse, Joseph, How Scientific Practices Matter: Reclaiming Philosophical Naturalism, University of Chicago Press 2002, 336pp, $49.00 (hbk), ISBN 0226730085.

Reviewed by Sharyn Clough , Oregon State University


In How Scientific Practices Matter, Rouse puts together a comprehensive and compelling set of arguments about the problems that beset philosophical naturalism, and offers, in turn, a welcome prescription for how these problems might be overcome. The strengths of his project include his fine metaphilosophical ability to detect similarities between thinkers as philosophically diverse as Heidegger and Neurath, as well as his facility with the technical details of complex arguments such as those found in Brandom’s Making It Explicit (1994, Harvard University Press). There are challenges, however, that come with presenting arguments with this level of scope and precision – challenges concerning audience and focus, for example. Some readers, even those compelled by his overall project, might find that the variety and depth of philosophical terrain covered makes for tough sledding. More on the variety and the sledding, shortly. Overall, as I hope to show, the effort spent by the reader is worth it, especially when the effort is targeted selectively to match the particular problems with naturalism the reader wants solved. The chapter reviews that follow are designed to aid in this selection process.


Rouse describes naturalism as a two-part thesis about what is authoritative: science over other forms of investigation (a metaphilosophical commitment he associates with Quine), and nature over the supernatural (a metaphysical commitment he associates with Nietzsche). He notes however, that, for the naturalist, what will count as science and what will count as nature cannot be specified in advance—identifying the boundaries between science and other forms of investigation, and between the natural and the supernatural is part of the on-going naturalist project.

The main focus of Rouse’s negative project is to show that current debates between naturalists and anti-naturalists have been “conceived in ways that block a satisfactory understanding of the relation between scientific inquiry and the world that inquiry makes manifest.”1 ; In particular, the normativity that drives scientific inquiry is typically, and problematically, viewed as conceptually distinct from the physical processes we associate with the natural world. The positive portion of his project hinges on his argument that the best philosophical articulation of what makes science authoritative is in terms of scientific practices in the world, rather than in terms of scientific representations of the world.

Ch. 1 The Problem of Manifest Necessity

Rouse begins by reviewing the anti-naturalism that links an otherwise diverse group of early 20th-century thinkers including Frege, Husserl, the early Wittgenstein, Moore, and Carnap. Each of these philosophers argued that our notions of “validity, objectivity or rationality of judgment” could not be explicated “on the basis of empirical matters of fact” (p. 5). For each of them, normativity required some notion of necessity, a notion which could not be based in the contingency we associate with the natural world. The writings of an equally diverse group including Heidegger, the later Wittgenstein, Neurath and Quine formed the earliest attacks on this anti-naturalist streak. But, Rouse argues, this new naturalism foundered, insofar as it still tried to ground normativity in some notion of necessity, albeit in a more local, a posteriori version.

By way of an object lesson, Rouse focuses on the anti-naturalism of Husserl and Carnap, in terms of the similarities in and effectiveness of the approach used by their respective critics, Heidegger and Neurath. The chapter is fascinating and difficult for anyone whose philosophical training has left them with a predisposition for finding comfort in one but not the other of the analytic and continental worlds. And the chapter might trouble the sort of person devoted to arcane exegetical debates concerning any of these historical heavyweights. Rouse’s highly original comparative work necessarily glosses over many of the important differences between them. According to Rouse, a revealing and previously unexamined similarity is that both Heidegger and Neurath point out the same problem in the work of their mentors—the problem of “manifest necessity.” Rouse explains: “Any attempt to ground normativity in necessity must be able to show how the alleged necessities are both authoritative and binding upon materially and historically situated agents” (p. 13). That is, when anti-naturalists (or naturalists for that matter) conceive of the normative/necessary and the material/contingent as ontologically separate, they must then complete the extra task of showing how the necessity is manifest in the natural world. Husserl’s appeals to the necessity provided by “the essential structures of consciousness” and Carnap’s appeals to the “formal necessities of logical syntax” both failed at this task, as will, Rouse predicts, any contemporary naturalist appeals to a posteriori necessities.

Rouse later argues that the real problem isn’t the failure to show how the ontologically separate worlds of the normative and the natural interact, but the splitting of the two in the first place. According to Rouse, the split is indicative of a lingering Cartesian representationalism, and the only solution is to stop conceiving of the normative and the material as separate–the two are constitutive of each other. As he explains in one of those sentences that immediately call out for a sticky note: “The articulation of what we are accountable to is inseparable from the practical process of holding ourselves accountable to it” (p. 76).

Ch. 2 The Dualism of Nature and Normativity

Another, and perhaps more familiar, site of naturalist/anti-naturalist debate concerns the relationship between the natural and social/human sciences. Here Rouse focuses primarily on the antinaturalism of Charles Taylor, contrasting it with Kuhn’s arguments that “the natural scientific disclosure of the world cannot be shorn… from the field of meaningful human activity” (p. 15). What Rouse contributes to the debate is to argue the reverse point as well, viz., that the field of meaningful human activity is best construed as “intra-active” with and constitutive of the natural world. This chapter marks the introduction of his arguments against any metaphysical splitting of the normative world of meaning and the natural world treated by science. McDowell’s criticisms of Davidson are introduced to help further illustrate the problems with normativity/nature dualism, though, as later chapters make clear, Rouse is generally sympathetic to Davidson’s project.

Ch. 3 Quinean Indeterminacy and Its Implications for Naturalism

This chapter is essential reading for those who have been long struggling to make good sense of Quine’s distinction between indeterminacy and underdetermination. Unlike some of Rorty’s earlier analyses that collapse indeterminacy into underdetermination, Rouse argues for the reverse.2 The implications for naturalism concern, roughly, the proper view of the relationship between the normative, semantic world of intentions and the natural, empirical world treated by science. According to Rouse, Quine splits these worlds, a split that results in the same conceptual problems encountered by Carnap.

Rouse’s use of Davidson is particularly important in this chapter. Rouse argues that Quinean indeterminacy of translation is right insofar as it denies “the existence of semantic facts as a separate domain of inquiry” (18). But when Quine contrasts semantic indeterminacy with the merely underdetermined world of physical facts, Quine betrays a commitment to the “third dogma of empiricism”: the split between our linguistic or conceptual schemes on the one hand and the empirical content on the other. Rouse continues: “Any specification of the supposedly prelinguistic or preconceptual content to which language or theory must be held responsible must itself be semantically articulated. The attempt to distinguish the physical from the meaningful must take place within language.” (p. 18, italics in original)

Of course, this reformulation of Quinean indeterminacy now invites the question of how we get beyond coherence within language to some sort of acknowledgement of the empirical world to which naturalism is committed. This a problem Davidson himself has faced, and from which characterizations of him as a coherence theorist draw. Rouse attempts a number of responses to the relativism of the coherence label, but it’s not clear to me that his arguments on this point will assuage the doubts of those readers not already convinced by Davidson.3

Returning to the naturalist debate, Rouse argues against Quine’s view of science as the objective representation of nature, insofar as Quine’s view presumes two ontologically distinct entities: the normative mapping the natural. Rouse argues that the appearance of a boundary between the two entities is an artifact of representationalist metaphysics. Any boundaries are contingent and a product of an interpretational process that is itself intentional. Quinean indeterminacy of meaning goes all the way down, as it were, in nature as well as meaning. Quine’s claim that there are no semantic facts is true, says Rouse, “if semantic facts are supposed to be a distinct domain of possible knowledge, separate from natural facts. But in that sense, there are no natural facts either” (p. 132-33). What then of nature? Here, Rouse responds with one of his first attempts to reassure readers that his pragmatic, holistic approach to naturalism still takes the natural seriously: “My reconstruction of the Quinean argument shows that conversation and consensus are contentful through people’s mutual interaction with a shared environment, and thus are never ’merely social’; yet that shared environment is not a domain of ’objective evidence’ in any sense that would escape involved, interpretive disclosure through ongoing practices” (p. 133). As I have hinted, I am one of those readers happily persuaded on this point by a pragmatist reading of Davidson, but Rouse anticipates that some of his readers will want a clearer sense of what he means by “ongoing practices,” especially in the context of science. Indeed, the reconception of scientific activity in terms of intentional practices, rather than “objective” representations, forms the focus of the latter half of his book.

Ch. 4 Feminist Challenges to the Reification of Knowledge

In this chapter Rouse contrasts what he characterizes as the reified notion of scientific practice found in the sociology of science (e.g., in the work of Barnes, Bloor, Latour and Woolgar) with the more nuanced notion guiding much of the work in feminist science studies (such as that of Haraway, Nelson and Potter). He argues that even when sociologists of science substitute sociology for Quine’s psychology or neurology, they still make the mistake of specifying in advance “the domain of the ’social’ and its role in constituting ’knowledge’ as a distinct domain of inquiry” (134). This a priori specification defeats the naturalism of their approach, leaving a “sociological remnant of the aspiration to first philosophy” (p. 134). He thinks feminist science studies, in general, avoid this problem, however, his discussion of the various approaches in feminist science studies is not detailed enough to support his claim.

In fact, I was unsure what to make of this section of the book. Readers unfamiliar with feminist science studies are not really given enough information to be persuaded, and those who are already familiar with the literature will likely have a number of counter-examples ready-to-hand. However, it is certainly safe to say that feminist science studies, at their best, tend not to focus on over-general concepts of scientific knowledge but rather on (the gendered nature of) scientific practices.

This switch in focus serves as an inspiration for Rouse to explore “the significance of understanding the sciences both as discursive practices and as bodily intra-actions with material surroundings” (p. 136). Reconceiving of science in this way allows Rouse to further his holistic/naturalist claims that the intentional, normative aspects of scientific discursive practices are co-constitutive of the objects in the natural world on which the scientific discourse is focused.

Ch. 5 Two Concepts of Scientific Practices

Here Rouse analyses Stephen Turner’s critical discussion of scientific practices. Turner is critical of accounts of science as practice, in part because he assumes such accounts must rely on a notion of practice as a set of “underlying regularities of performance or commitment” (p. 20). Rouse shows how his own account of scientific practices avoids the problems discussed by Turner, insofar as Rouse conceives of practices as “held together by a normative accountability” that “outruns” any such regularities (pp. 19-20). Rouse notes parallels between his preferred account of scientific practices and Davidson’s arguments about language practices—both arguments work against the view that these practices are essentially convention-driven.

Turner’s criticisms of science as practice serve not only as a foil for Rouse’s own account but also as an illustration of the pervasiveness of the representationalist dualism between the normative and the natural. Rouse notes in Turner’s work the lingering representationalist worry that if we view science “merely” as a set of practices, we fail to account for the natural world that science is supposed to objectively represent. In response, and again taking a cue from Davidson, Rouse argues that “the attitudes and responses that identify a practice (including a discursive practice) are only contentful amid ongoing intra-actions with the world” and “to ask how our representations can ever get a foothold in the world is to presume, erroneously, that one could ever make or understand representations without already having a foothold in the world” (173).

Chapters 6-8 focus on the work of Brandom and Haugeland and while Rouse is generally supportive of their accounts of the relationship between the material world of causes and the normative world of intentionality, he notes problematic parallels with Turner. Even in the writings of these self-avowed pragmatists, Rouse argues, a representationalist dualism remains. However, the diagnosis and treatment of this dualism requires from Rouse a careful and painfully detailed approach. Even the most cursory glance at these last three chapters alerts the reader to the fact that the tough sledding encountered in earlier discussions of Heidegger and Neurath is nothing compared to the tricky terrain proffered by analyses of Brandom’s 740 page tome, Making It Explicit.4

Ch. 6 Perception, Action and Discursive Practices

Working again to his strengths as a comparative theorist, Rouse begins by noting that the problem for Brandom parallels “the related failures [that] Heidegger and Neurath found in Husserl’s and Carnap’s appeals to logical or transcendental necessity: [Brandom] must make intelligible the force of logical and semantic norms in the concrete historical, material world” (p. 200). Brandom proposes to show that force by reminding us that “in addition to talking about objects, speakers interact with them causally in perception and action” (pp. 200-201). But in the end, argues Rouse, Brandom’s account needs to be supplemented because it retains a residual representationalist split between perceiving and acting.

At this point, Rouse argues that a Davidsonian analysis can no longer help us, because Davidson’s anomalous monism keeps the causal and the intentional realms ontologically separate. Rouse promises that these two realms can and should be “intratwined.”5 I would have preferred a more detailed discussion of the contrast with Davidson here as I’m not sure he wouldn’t have been happy to accept Rouse’s conclusion, namely, that “discursive practices and practical /perceptual responsiveness are not separable domains or compartments within the world, but are instead dimensions of the entire world as a meaningfully configured practical field” (p. 232).

Ch. 7 Desires, Bodies and Normative Force

Here the discussion begun in the preceding chapter continues, with Haugeland’s work added to the mix. Rouse argues that Brandom and Haugeland share a “problematic common ground” insofar as “both of them seek the binding ’force’ of normative accountability in commitments undertaken and sustained by subjects” (p. 21). The problem is that their accounts presume that “there is no normative force except to the extent that subjects impose it upon themselves”, and how, Rouse asks, could such a commitment ever be binding? (p. 21). Rouse wants us, instead, to take seriously the normative force produced through “practical-perceptual intra-action in discursive practices” (p. 21). (Here is one of the places where the sleds of even the most stalwart philosophers are in danger of grinding to a halt). Rouse attempts to make clearer the normative force provided by practical-perceptual intra-action in Ch. 9.

Ch. 8 Experimentation, Theory and the Normativity of Natural Phenomenon

In this penultimate chapter, Rouse provides an articulation of the relationship between normativity and causality, returning to the idea that just as neither our understanding of language, nor of scientific practice, requires any actual regularities or patterns, so too, with our understanding of causality. Building off of Cartwright’s discussion of nomological machines, Rouse argues that by characterizing a particular intra-action as causal we are simply indicating that “under the right circumstances its pattern would recur” but, he continues, “there need be no actual regularity that it instantiates” (p. 280). His discussion of how this understanding of causality conflicts, or not, with Hume, piqued but did not satisfy my curiosity.

Rouse ends the arguments of this chapter by noting that “we are accountable to what is at stake in our belonging (causally and normatively) to the material-discursive world: our fate is bound up with what is at issue and at stake in our practices, although those stakes are not yet definitely settled—indeed that is part of what it is for them to be ’at stake’ “(p. 25). Having argued for the possibility of a normative notion of causality, Rouse takes us to the conclusion of his naturalist project.

Ch. 9 Natural Necessity and the Normativity of Scientific Practices.

In this concluding chapter, Rouse returns critically to the theme of normativity and necessity, arguing that the only notion of “modality” a good naturalist can accept is that provided by normativity (now construed as an ineliminable part of our scientific examinations of the natural world). As he has argued in his discussion of the failures of both Carnap and Husserl, we cannot ground normativity in any of notion of necessity over and against our scientific intra-actions with the natural world, whether that necessity is understood as nomological or causal. Returning to this set of arguments against the anti-naturalism of early twentieth-century philosophy reminds readers of the larger focus that links the wide array of arguments marshaled throughout Rouse’s book—his examinations of Heidegger and Neurath, Quine and Davidson, Kuhn and Barad, Brandom and Haugeland, and many, many others, are all brought to a precise convergence in support of his holistic and pragmatic vision of normativity as always and already part of any articulation of the natural world, and vice-versa.

Consistent with the view of naturalism that Rouse supports in his introductory remarks, the naturalism he leaves us with at the conclusion of his work does not demand a pre-determined conception of science or of nature, but instead “locates us in the midst of scientific and technological practices that continue to reshape what it is to be nature, and how we can understand ourselves and our possibilities as natural beings” (p. 360). This sort of radical reconceptualization of the naturalist project is important and necessary, and Rouse’s contribution is a huge achievement. With a book of this scope, readers should feel free to be selective with respect to the chapters, debates and characters attended to. That said, there is pretty much something for everyone in its pages.


1. Rouse, How Scientific Practices Matter (2002, University of Chicago Press, p. 5). All further page references are to this work.

2. For an update of Rorty’s views on this point see the illuminating exchange between Bjørn Ramberg and Rorty in Rorty and His Critics, edited by Brandom (2000, Blackwell, pp. 351-377).

3. Davidson argues against the relativist or coherentist interpretation of his work in his “Afterthoughts” to “A Coherence Theory of Truth and Knowledge” in Reading Rorty, edited by Alan Malachowski (1990, Blackwell, pp. 134-137).

4. Rebecca Kukla’s review of Rouse is particularly helpful for working through the complexities of the latter chapters of this book (2004, Philosophy of Science, 71/2, pp. 216-219).

5. Even those readers compelled by “intra-act” might justifiably bristle at “intra-twine”, but I place the blame for Rouse’s use of this jargon squarely on the after-effects of having spent so much time ploughing through Brandom’s work (not to mention Heidegger’s!).