How Should We Live?: A Practical Approach to Everyday Morality

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John Kekes, How Should We Live?: A Practical Approach to Everyday Morality, University of Chicago Press, 2014, 250pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226155654.

Reviewed by John Cottingham, Heythrop College, University of London/University of Reading


"I often see people propose to us patterns of life which neither the proposer nor his hearers have any hope of following, or, what is more, any desire to follow" (19). Michel de Montaigne's sharp observation, quoted with approval by John Kekes, serves as an apt motto for what follows: a sustained critique of ideal and absolutist theories of morality, and indeed of theories of morality of any kind. Anti-theory theories of morality, the author suggests, are perhaps better than pro-theory theories of morality, but best of all is to have no theory of morality at all.

As his subtitle indicates, Kekes offers not a theory, but an "approach", one that insists that charting a course through life must rely on "context-dependent" assessments of the specific problems that confront us day by day. But the approach is emphatically not a relativist one, nor is it what is sometimes called "particularist". Kekes believes that there are indeed objective principles or ideals to guide us, ideals that are not determined merely by human taste or convention, but rooted in universal human needs. Yet none of these ideals is to be elevated to the status of an absolute ideal that should always hold sway. There are many ideals that meet the requirements of practical reason, and hence serve as valid guides for our day-to-day decisions, but none of them is overriding.

The main and frequently reiterated message of the book is that there is no way of meeting the supposed requirement for a general rational decision procedure to resolve conflicts between ideals. Kekes is preoccupied with the messiness of the human condition. The only self we have is "riddled with conflicts and ambivalence and hence it is unreliable" (216). And yet "Our conflicted self is the only resource we have for coping with the conflicts of our conflicted self" (215). This pessimistic view of the ineradicable conflicts in our nature leads Kekes emphatically to reject Christine Korsgaard's attempt to base morality on the ideals of autonomy and "self-constitution", where authentic agency consists in my being able to see my actions as an expression of myself as an integrated whole. The reality, Kekes argues, is that "life is always more complex than theories about life, and the self is divided in more complex ways than can be dreamed of in any philosophy" (48).

The book proceeds by discussing in turn the work of several influential ethical theorists of our time, including, amongst others, Harry Frankfurt, Charles Taylor and Alasdair MacIntyre. In the case of Frankfurt, and his championing of reflective self-evaluation as the key to a well-lived life, Kekes refreshingly challenges the time-honoured Socratic maxim that "the unexamined life is not worth living". He imagines the unexamined life of a "simple, kind person", the "Dutiful Man", who tries to balance as well as he can his conflicting duties and desires. Rather than reflectively standing back from his immediate involvements, such a person just gets on with the job in hand -- the day to day task of juggling his competing priorities. And for Kekes this is a paradigm of ordinary decent human agency, which is, or can be, perfectly in order as it is: there is no compelling reason to think it must be ethically or eudaimonically improved upon by a dose of second-order evaluation.

Similar considerations inform Kekes's objections to Taylor's ethical theory, which comes in for particularly sharp criticism, partly because its "high-flown metaphysical speculation" (110) is anathema to Kekes's own piecemeal empirical approach. Yet the "speculation" that so irks Kekes seems to me to boil down to a rather simple idea: that deep in our nature, despite all our conflicts and confusions, is a desire to orient ourselves to the good and to see our lives shaped by it and directed towards it. One reason why Kekes finds this idea so exasperating is that he thinks it will lead to intolerance: "it leads the ideal theorists who accept it to dictate how others should live" (111). But this familiar criticism, often levelled at various kinds of ethical objectivism, is in my view mistaken: there is nothing about believing that there is a right answer to how humans should live that need imply that I or anyone else has a hotline to that answer, still less that the nature of the good requires a coercive or dictatorial approach to others. Even those who, like Taylor, sometimes speak of the inner voice of conscience (as indeed Socrates did before him) characteristically can and do allow that careful rational reflection is needed to discern what should be done in particular cases.

The idea of narrative unity, particularly in the work of MacIntyre, follows next in Kekes's catalogue of suspect ideal theories of life. Again, empirical considerations come to the fore, with some acute observations on how the course of a human life may be resistant to an overarching narrative. We may, for example, change, and hence "come to see our hitherto successful narrative as contrary or irrelevant to how we now want to live" (140). More generally, Kekes argues, the whole idea of narrative only really makes sense from a distance, as it were, as when a historian or a biographer assesses a completed life. "We cannot construct a narrative of our own life as a whole while we are living it, because we and our life are changing as we are living it" (141).

The strategy followed here is fairly typical of the book as a whole, which constantly brings us back to "the disorder and confusion of human affairs", in David Hume's pregnant phrase. Perhaps the key question to be raised here is whether these undeniable messy features of human life do really undercut the validity of the various theories that are examined. Kekes is surely right to point out, as he frequently does, that there are millions of ordinary people who live without time or inclination to shape their lives according to architectonic plans, patterns, narratives or ideals. But this seems quite compatible with recognizing that nevertheless humans are by nature beings who need meaning in their lives, and that what the targeted philosophers are really trying to do is to make explicit the best way of articulating that need and exploring its implications for a worthwhile human life.

The big surprise of the book comes at the end, when we see Bernard Williams targeted as sharing some of the faults of the ideal theorists who have occupied the rest of the book. On the face of it, Williams seems in a completely different category, given his stressing of the "radical contingency of the ethical", his resistance to the overridingness of what he called "the morality system", and his analysis of cases like that of "Gauguin", where the question of which value is to trump the others hinges on individual contingencies of talent, and is even hostage to contingencies of outcome. These central features of Williams's account of ethics, together with many others, all seem to signal his opposition to the idea of an ideal template for human conduct. Kekes acknowledges some of these passages, but sees Williams's later work on truthfulness as sometimes pointing in the other direction -- towards an ideal that is "necessary and overriding in all contexts" (192). I am not convinced that Kekes interprets Williams correctly here (the strong Nietzschean flavour of Truth and Truthfulness suggests to me otherwise); but at all events, consistent with his practical approach, Kekes argues that we can always find specific cases where dwelling on the truth is not the best way for someone to live (195).

Readers of Kekes's impressive and prolific philosophical output of recent years will find many of his familiar virtues manifest in this latest offering. The writing is lucid, careful, tenacious, and always accessible, and if there is a certain dryness of tone, the author endeavours to temper this by providing schematic "real life" examples (the School Teacher, the Father, the Nurse, the Civil Servant, the Betrayed Woman) in an attempt to make his arguments more vivid. The book's overall message is a kind of hymn to ground floor, practical reason, which allows us to "live reasonably in the context of civilized societies in a plurality of ways" (225), but without any overarching philosophical theory to guide us. The sober message is well articulated, but I suspect it will do little to dispel the perennial allure of theory. To be sure, the grand theories of moral philosophers, like those of historians, may often seem "over the top", and subject to obvious counterexamples -- perhaps that is the price to be paid for operating, as they must, at some degree of abstraction from the phenomena they strive to illuminate. But without the stimulus and challenge they provide, the struggle to understand our messy and conflicted human lives would probably be even harder than it is.