How Successful Is Naturalism?

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Georg Gasser (ed.), How Successful Is Naturalism?, Ontos, 2007, 300pp., $98.95 (hbk), ISBN 3938793678.

Reviewed by Joseph Rouse, Wesleyan University


Naturalism has been the predominant orientation in analytic philosophy for perhaps the last third of the 20th Century, especially in the United States; even its critics now commonly endorse some more tolerant and inclusive version of naturalism.  This sustained period of philosophical commitment strongly suggests a need for a reflective assessment of naturalism's successes, persistent difficulties or challenges, and continuing prospects as a philosophical program.  This edited volume, the product of a workshop at the 2006 International Wittgenstein Symposium in Austria, is a collaborative attempt at such an assessment.  The majority of its contributors are from central Europe, especially Austria and Germany.  The volume thereby offers the advantages of distance from and perspective on how naturalism has been conceived and propounded in the United States, where it has been most firmly rooted.  The contributors include proponents and critics of naturalism in roughly equal numbers, and the volume is framed by the editor's brief but judicious survey of some of the varieties of naturalism.  To understand the strengths and weaknesses that lead to the volume's own mixed success in its intended task, we need to rehearse quickly some of the different ways in which 'naturalism' has been conceived and discussed in contemporary philosophy, and the challenges these differences pose to efforts to assess its prospects.

Anyone hoping to characterize naturalism as a philosophical position, or even as a family of related positions, must find a way to sort out the various divergent and even opposing philosophical claims propounded in its name.  Recognition of the extent of this variance commonly suggests characterizing naturalism in the more diffuse form of either a developing research tradition, or a philosophical stance or orientation.  Such characterizations complicate any assessment of naturalism, however, since even the decisive refutation of a prominent naturalist position might nevertheless constitute a constructive advance for the research program, or a useful refinement of the stance.  The editor's introduction takes explicit cognizance of this challenge, although the contributors differ in the extent of their acknowledgment of and response to it.

One often useful way to identify a philosophical stance is to emphasize what it opposes or rejects.  Undoubtedly naturalism arose primarily in opposition to supernaturalism, and more specifically theism in philosophy.  Yet theism is no longer a central issue for most philosophical naturalists, and those who still propound it within philosophy typically fight a rearguard action to secure only a limited place for God, or for religious belief and practice, within an otherwise scientifically explicable natural world.  The only paper within the volume to address theist challenges to naturalism, Nancey Murphy's invitation to a rational comparative assessment of Christian theism and naturalism as philosophical traditions, does not convincingly re-open the issue.  Murphy's juxtaposition of the crises faced by Christianity (including religious pluralism, the problem of natural evil, epistemological challenges to theological reasoning, and the apparent pre-eminence of a scientific cosmology) with the crises naturalists confront in explaining the persistence of religious belief or accounting for moral authority is unlikely to prompt a more salutary assessment of theism or its philosophical prospects, or reason to discount the comparative prospects of naturalism.

Within the broadly secular practice of contemporary philosophy, two alternative oppositional stances have replaced anti-supernaturalism in defining a naturalistic orientation, leading to at least two divergent strands of philosophical naturalism.  One approach, sometimes characterized as "scientific naturalism" (De Caro and MacArthur 2004), and more often described as "ontological naturalism" in this volume, now might be said to define itself in opposition to humanism rather than theism.  Here lies the motivation for some naturalists' hostility to folk psychology, freedom, transcendental reason, the irreducibility of consciousness or first-person standpoints, and above all, any conception of normativity as sui generis.  Human beings live in a world indifferent or even hostile to our interests, desires, values, or perspectival priorities, and the sciences provide our primary access to this anthropo-peripheral world to which we must accommodate ourselves.  This anti-humanist strain of naturalism aspires to a hard-headed, resolute commitment to a thoroughly scientific self-understanding that can free us from the residual strands of self-aggrandizing illusion or wishful thinking that still confer disproportionate significance upon our all-too-human preoccupations.

A different, more inclusive conception of naturalism emphasizes a tolerant continuity of philosophy with the natural sciences.  Naturalism has long defined itself in opposition to conceptions of philosophy as autonomous from the natural sciences.  Yet here there has been considerable evolution.  When Frege and Husserl inveighed against psychologism in logic and naturalism in philosophy at the turn of the 20th Century, the naturalists they had in mind often sought to dispense with philosophy altogether; in Germany, the stakes were heightened by the struggles between philosophers and experimental psychologists for university chairs in philosophy.  A century later, naturalism has become an unequivocally philosophical stance toward philosophical issues, which appropriates the resources and/or the authority of natural science for philosophical ends.  If you want to find out about naturalism, you still need to read philosophy journals rather than just the scientific literature.  Within anglophone philosophy, naturalism has thus succeeded empiricism as the primary expression of a scientific orientation within philosophy, by loosening empiricist opposition to metaphysics, causality, and alethic modalities, and replacing formal logic and a priori analysis with cognitive science or evolutionary biology as the preferred basis for philosophical understanding of thought and action.

Differences between these two ways of defining a naturalistic orientation can be expressed in multiple ways.  The anti-humanist strain of naturalism is often radically revisionist, confining philosophical inquiry within the austere constraints of a physicalist ontology, a third-person standpoint, or the domains governed by natural laws.  Many familiar ways of thinking and talking must be reduced, revised, or eliminated to fit these constraints.  More inclusive versions of naturalism are not broadly revisionist in this way, while still providing considerable resources for criticism of specific positions and arguments.  Another way to distinguish the two strains is by considering where the naturalist looks for philosophical guidance.  For many anti-humanist conceptions, nature (as represented in scientific theories) provides the touchstone for philosophical work; for the more tolerant approaches, scientific practices in all their diversity provide the relevant philosophical resources, with no prior commitment to hierarchies among the sciences in their ontological commitments or explanatory resources.  Within this volume, however, the most common locution for differentiating these two broad strategies is "reductive" or "non-reductive" naturalism, with the former also sometimes characterized as "ontological" naturalism.

In practice, naturalism also invokes different considerations depending upon one's philosophical sub-field.  In epistemology, for example, the primary issues are methodological, such as the contrast between first- and third-person standpoints, or the relevance of empirical psychology or sociology for understanding knowledge philosophically.  In philosophy of mind, by contrast, the focus is upon metaphysical concerns about consciousness, propositional attitudes, or the scope of 'mind' ranging from narrow content to distributed cognition.  Yet naturalism in the philosophy of science (Giere 1985) may provide the most striking contrast to other versions of naturalism.  Here, naturalism requires close attention to scientific practice, whether one addresses general features of experimentation and theoretical modeling, or the specific issues that arise within ongoing research in various scientific disciplines.  The contrast is striking, because many of the conceptions of science or scientific understanding that are taken for granted in naturalized epistemology or philosophy of mind would not pass muster among naturalists in the philosophy of science.  Naturalistic philosophy of science emphasizes models rather than laws, ontological and methodological pluralism, and a healthy respect for the irreducible complexity of the world except where carefully engineered and regimented in laboratories or their technological extensions.  Most significantly, what Paul Teller (2001) has dubbed the "Perfect Model Model" of scientific knowledge is widely rejected by naturalists in the philosophy of science, but taken for granted by most naturalists elsewhere.

How do these different conceptions of what is at issue in naturalism play out within the essays under review?  Too often, despite some attempts at cross-references, the critics and proponents of naturalism in this volume talk past one another.  The versions of naturalism defended by Gerhard Vollmer, Thomas Sukopp, Konrad Talmont-Kaminski, Josef Quitterer, and Johannes Brandl are resolutely modest, tolerant, and inclusive.  Vollmer, for example, characterizes the naturalistic program that he would endorse in terms that many philosophers who think of themselves as anti-naturalists could also endorse without qualms, e.g.,  "(1) Only as much metaphysics as necessary!  (2) A minimal realism [such] that a world without man is possible …  (5) No transcendental authorities related to experience …  (7) The mental faculties of man do not go beyond nature" (p. 42).  Quitterer defends a tolerant naturalism in the philosophy of mind by arguing that the naturalistic opponents of folk psychology arrive at their views only by illicitly presuming an event-ontology that allows no place for "proper physical correlates" (p. 228) of persistent mental states or their enduring bearers.  He then goes on to contrast this philosophical austerity to the plural "ontological commitments of neurobiological theories" (p. 235), which should make folk psychological categories unproblematic (to date) for naturalists.  Brandl similarly argues that a properly modest naturalism makes consciousness quite unmysterious, and more generally, claims that such a modest naturalism "returns to the goal of metaphysical neutrality initially pursued by logical empiricism" (p. 256).

The critics, by contrast, almost invariably target more stridently revisionist, anti-humanist, ontological conceptions of naturalism.  Lynne Rudder Baker, for example, extends her earlier arguments that accommodating first-person perspectives is an especially challenging problem for the "relentlessly third-personal" theories required by reductive naturalism, through critical assessment of Thomas Metzinger's attempt to meet her challenge via a "third-person sub-personal account of the first-person perspective" (p. 223).  P.M.S. Hacker presents a wholesale criticism of Quine's conception of epistemology naturalized and its development within Quine's own philosophical practice as reason for "passing by the naturalistic turn"; he thus by-passes all subsequent developments in naturalized epistemology, which although often inspired by Quine are rarely beholden to him.  Winfried Löffler addresses some prominent denials of freedom of the will within the German popular science literature, arguing that the experimental evidence they cite utterly fails to support their conclusions.  No philosophical naturalist, however, would be inclined to disagree with Löffler's demolition of these hasty, simplistic and polemical treatments of a complex philosophical issue.

The papers by Michael Rea and by co-authors Georg Gasser and Matthias Stefan each seek to argue against naturalistic approaches more generally by framing dilemmas that would leave the aspiring naturalist with no acceptable options.  Gasser and Stefan's dilemma purports to place an unusually heavy burden of proof on ontological naturalism.  Without a clear and principled demarcation of those sciences that appropriately provide resources for naturalists, they argue, naturalists are forced to take on the challenge of advocating a strongly reductive physicalism.  The alternative is either a trivializing openness to any discipline purporting to be a science, or else principled grounds for including some core sciences within the naturalistic canon and excluding others.  If naturalists can tolerate ontological gaps that leave room for the autonomy of biology from physics and chemistry, why be less tolerant of intentional psychology or the social sciences?  Yet their apparent demand for principled philosophical arguments to determine these matters in advance is precisely the kind of philosophical stance that most naturalists eschew.  Why not settle the question of which sciences seem both resistant to reduction and yet worthy of ontological commitment through ongoing discussion of the actual practices and achievements of the various disciplines?  The absence of detailed discussion of any of the more inclusive naturalisms supposedly ruled out by this challenge highlights the abstract and even perhaps a priori cast to their line of argument.

Michael Rea proposes a different kind of dilemma.  To adopt naturalism as a specific thesis would require a dogmatism not consistent with naturalists' openness to following the ongoing development of the sciences.  Yet Rea then argues that alternative conceptions of naturalism as a research program allied to the methods of science lead to an unattractive and perhaps self-defeating commitment to substance dualism about minds.  The difficulty is that Rea's argument turns on some contentious premises, from realism about arguments to the best explanation to a specific conception of intrinsic modal properties, and even then requires an argument too lengthy and complicated even to summarize in his paper.  Many readers will suspect that Rea's argument, if valid, is best regarded as a reductio of his conjoined premises.

From my perspective, the most striking feature of the volume is the almost complete lack of attention to naturalism in the philosophy of science, and the challenges it poses to the very terms of the debate in other philosophical fields.  The one exception is Ulrich Frey's paper on the uses of cognitive science for understanding scientific reasoning.  Yet Frey's aims are remarkably limited.  He plausibly suggests that the evolved cognitive limits of human individuals might have explanatory significance for understanding scientists' repeated failures to grasp the causal complexity of some unsuccessful ecological interventions.  Yet he says little about how recognition of our cognitive limits might affect broader philosophical views of science, and nothing about the significance of these claims for the wider debates about naturalism within the rest of the volume.  Indeed, Frey gives no consideration to whether instrumentally or socially distributed cognition might limit the significance for science more generally of his proposed attention to individual cognitive limitations.

I found Konrad Talmont-Kaminski's effort to reframe what is at stake in debates over naturalism perhaps the most interesting, and certainly the most distinctively European contribution to the volume.  Talmont-Kaminski calls attention to the widespread disenchantment with Enlightenment values and the pretensions of human reason successively evoked throughout the 20th Century by trench warfare, aerial bombardment of cities, the Holocaust and other genocidal projects, and the spectre of nuclear annihilation.  In this context, he suggests, a tolerant naturalism about human cognition encourages a modest, fallibilist endorsement of "the sometimes inventive and sometimes methodical application of our limited abilities, context-dependent methods and imperfect knowledge" (p. 196), as a viable alternative to the many forms of nihilism or fanaticism that often accompanied or followed the events of the past century.

Despite the effort to bring together critics and proponents of naturalism, the papers actually collected here more or less converge upon acceptance of broader, more inclusive versions of naturalism, which seem to provide substantial common ground for many of the contributors, including those who take critical stances toward more stringent naturalistic projects.  In this respect, the volume bears comparison to de Caro and MacArthur's (2004) more univocal collection of papers along those lines, but the de Caro/MacArthur collection is philosophically deeper and more consistently satisfying throughout, and also considers a wider range of issues in contemporary debates about naturalism.


De Caro, Mario, and David MacArthur 2004.  Naturalism in Question.  Cambridge: Harvard University Press.

Giere, Ronald 1985.  Philosophy of Science Naturalized.  Philosophy of Science 52: 331-356.

Teller, Paul 2001.  Twilight of the Perfect Model Model.  Erkenntnis 55: 393-415.