How Terrorism Is Wrong: Morality and Political Violence

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Virginia Held, How Terrorism Is Wrong: Morality and Political Violence, Oxford University Press, 2008, 205pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195329599.

Reviewed by Igor Primoratz, University of Melbourne


This is a book on terrorism and political violence more generally, written by a philosopher and accordingly focusing on conceptual and moral, rather than empirical or historical, questions. The book is meant for fellow philosophers and political theorists, but it is written clearly and without philosophical jargon, and will be accessible, and of much interest, to the general reader too.

While political violence is a traditional topic in political and moral philosophy, terrorism -- the type of political violence generally considered most difficult to defend -- was not much discussed before the attacks in the US on 11 September 2001. Virginia Held is one of the few philosophers who gave it sustained attention before it became a fashionable topic. The present book is a collection of seven essays she has published over the last twenty-odd years and one previously unpublished paper. Some essays discuss terrorism or political violence generally, while others look into such related issues as the ways the media deals with political violence, or collective responsibility for ethnic hatred and violence. There is also an essay on the methods of moral inquiry.

In her approach to moral questions, Held combines consequentialism, deontological ethics and the ethics of care. The relevance of the last approach to discussing issues of political violence is rather limited, and Held's position on terrorism and political violence is grounded in consequentialist and deontological considerations of a more traditional type. So is just war theory, but Held's views are not a version of that theory. Indeed, she doubts that just war theory can be of much help in understanding and judging contemporary armed conflicts.

The title of the book might be thought somewhat misleading, as Held does not so much seek to show how terrorism is wrong as how it can be right. To be sure, a title highlighting the latter prospect probably would not have been a good idea in the current atmosphere of the "war on terror." This "war" is both driven and defended by a "moral clarity" claimed by leaders of some major powers and by many analysts and commentators. Held rightly challenges this facile "moral clarity," according to which all terrorism is morally the same, clearly distinct from war, and a monopoly of insurgents, who are both amoral and utterly irrational and fanatical, and therefore never to be engaged with in dialogue or negotiation. She goes on to argue that we should not adopt a sweeping moral rejection of all terrorism, whatever the cause it serves, the circumstances in which it does so, and the consequences of refraining from it; that terrorism is not "uniquely atrocious"; and that it is not necessarily morally worse than war.

The scope and import of any moral assessment of terrorism depends on just what is meant by "terrorism". Accordingly, Held discusses at some length the question of how the term should be defined. The usage over the two centuries or so since the term entered political and moral discourse in the West has been notoriously confusing, fraught with moral emotions and political passions, and plagued by relativism and double standards. It is in such cases that philosophy can demonstrate its relevance to public debates by clarifying central concepts and main positions, spotting missteps in argument, exposing prejudice and double standards, and thus facilitating more rational and discerning moral deliberation and choice. Most definitions of terrorism crafted by philosophers acknowledge the two traits that make up the core concept underlining all shifts in descriptive and evaluative meaning: terrorism is violence aiming at intimidation (fear, terror). Beyond this, philosophers tend to disagree, most importantly on whether terrorism is violence against civilians (non-combatants, innocent people), or can also target members of the military and security services and highly placed government officials. This is the question of a narrow vs. wide definition. A wide definition is in line with common use over two centuries, whereas a narrow definition is revisionary. Yet a narrow definition may be more appropriate in the context of moral assessment of violence and terrorism. Surely there is a considerable moral difference between planting a bomb in an office of (what is considered) an extremely oppressive government and killing a number of its officials, and planting a bomb in a coffee shop and killing a number of common citizens.

Held prefers a wide definition, for reasons I do not find convincing. One is common use. Held points out that the attack on the Marine barracks in Lebanon in 1983, or much Palestinian violence directed at Israeli soldiers, would not count as terrorism on a narrow definition, while the bombing of Dresden or Hiroshima would, and finds these implications unacceptable. To me, they seem just right. She quotes Walter Laqueur's remark that "most terrorist groups in the contemporary world have been attacking the military, the police, and the civilian population" (p. 55) as showing the inadequacy of a narrow definition. But surely the fact that a group has engaged in terrorism to an extent sufficient to consider it a terrorist group does not turn every act of political violence committed by the group into an act of terrorism. Finally, Held rejects narrow definitions on the ground that "it is not at all clear who the 'innocent' are as distinct from the 'legitimate' targets. We can perhaps agree that small children are innocent, but beyond this, there is little moral clarity" (pp. 19-20). Yet even if only "small children" were morally protected against violence that would be a weighty consideration, as indiscriminate political violence against civilians or common citizens is bound to kill and maim children too. Moreover, there are other classes of civilians that are just as clearly innocent in the relevant sense, i.e. innocent of the (alleged) injustice or oppression: opponents of the government, those too old or infirm to take part in political life, or those inculpably ignorant of the immorality of their government's policies.

The book offers two somewhat different definitions of terrorism: as "political violence that usually spreads fear beyond those attacked" and "perhaps more than anything else … resembles small-scale war" (p. 21), and as political violence employed with "the intention either to spread fear or to harm non-combatants" (p. 76). Both definitions run together war and terrorism, and imply that an act of war proper, i.e. one aimed at a legitimate military target, counts as terrorism. For, as Trotsky pointed out in his defense of the "red terror", "war … is founded upon intimidation… . [It] destroys only an insignificant part of the conquered army, intimidating the remainder and breaking their will" (Terrorism and Communism, Ann Arbor: The University of Michigan Press, 1961, p. 58). Held accepts this implication of her position; I find it problematic.

Philosophers working with a wide definition of terrorism usually distinguish terrorism that targets the military and high government officials and terrorism that attacks common citizens, and argue that the former type of terrorism can be morally justified in certain circumstances, while the latter type is never, or almost never, justified. Held does not take this line. Her book offers two different justifications of terrorist violence, and both apply to the latter as well as the former kind of terrorism.

The first is in terms of the responsibility of citizens in a democracy for what their government does on their behalf. This justification is only suggested at several points in the book and is never developed and defended from likely objections. Held does not make it clear whether she sees common citizens as proper objects of terrorist violence because, as voters, they authorize the government's actions and policies (p. 20), or on account of various types and degrees of support they give the government (pp. 56, 78). Both these lines of argument are open to serious queries.

Held's second justification of terrorism, presented in chapter 4 )“Terrorism, Rights, and Political Goals”) is carefully spelled out. It focuses on the issue of human rights. When human rights of a person or group are not respected, what may we do in order to ensure that they are? On one view, known as consequentialism of rights, if the only way to ensure respect of a certain right of A and B is to infringe on the same right of C, we will be justified in doing so. Held does not accept such trade-offs in rights with the aim of maximizing their respect. But she points out that rights sometimes come into conflict, whether directly or indirectly. When that happens, we cannot avoid comparing the rights involved in terms of their stringency and making certain choices. That applies to the case of terrorism too. Terrorism violates some human rights of its victims. But its advocates claim that in certain circumstances a limited use of terrorism is the only way of bringing about a society in which the human rights of all will be respected.

Even when that is so, it is not enough to make resort to terrorism justified. But it will be justified if an additional condition is met: that of distributive justice. If there is a society where the human rights of a part of the population are respected, while the same rights of another part of the population are being violated, and if the only way of putting an end to that and bringing about a society in which human rights of all are respected is a limited use of terrorism, and finally, if terrorism is directed against members of the first group, which until now has been privileged as far as respect of human rights is concerned -- then terrorism will be morally justified. This is an argument of distributive justice, brought to bear on the problem of violations of human rights. It is more just to equalize the violations of human rights in a stage of transition to a society where the rights of all are respected, than to allow the group which has already suffered large-scale violations of human rights to suffer more such violations (assuming that in both cases we are dealing with violations of the same, or equally stringent, human rights). Human rights of many are going to be violated in any case. "If we must have rights violations, a more equitable distribution of such violations is better than a less equitable one" (p. 88).

This is an original, deontological cum consequentialist justification of terrorism. Neither the indispensable contribution of terrorism to bringing about equal respect of human rights of all nor the justice in the distribution of violations of such rights in the transition stage is, in itself, enough to justify its use. Each is necessary, and jointly the two are sufficient for its justification. Obviously, a critique that reduces Held's position to either of its prongs falls short of the mark. So does the objection that terrorism is as a matter of fact highly unlikely ever to help usher in a better, more just society. If so, that tells against terrorism, rather than against Held's (or any other) stringent moral requirements for a morally defensible recourse to it.

Another objection is that in allowing for sacrificing such basic human rights as the right to life and to bodily security of individual victims of terrorism for the sake of a more just distribution of violations of the same rights within a group in the course of transition to a stage where these rights will be respected throughout that group, Held adopts a collectivistic position that offends against the principles of separateness of persons and respect for persons. In response, Held argues that

to fail to achieve a more just distribution of violations of rights (through the use of terrorism if that is the only means available) is to fail to recognize that those whose rights are already not fairly respected are individuals in their own right, not merely members of a group … whose rights can be ignored. … Arguments for achieving a just distribution of rights violations need not be arguments … that are more than incidentally about groups. They can be arguments about individuals' rights to basic fairness. (pp. 89-90)

Still, a common citizen belonging to the relatively privileged section of the population has done nothing to forfeit her right to life. If she is killed by a terrorist seeking to make the distribution of right to life violations in the entire population more just, her right to life is violated for reasons to do with the group: for the sake of more justice within the group. This has nothing to do with her sins of commission or omission, and in this sense Held's is a collectivistic argument -- and an argument that I, for one, do not find convincing. Held argues that, if we fail to resort to terrorism in the circumstances described in her argument, we thereby fail to recognize that individuals belonging to the disadvantaged section of the population "are individuals in their own right," rather than merely members of a group whose human rights can be ignored. This argument is predicated on moral equivalence of acts and omissions, and on ascription of negative responsibility. This, too, I find problematic. We do not fail to respect the right to life of disadvantaged individuals when we fail to kill or maim other individuals, personally innocent of the plight of the former. The disadvantaged individuals do not have a right that we should engage in terrorism in their behalf, and we do not have a duty to do that. Indeed, I believe we have a duty not to do that.

Whether Held's two-prong justification of terrorism can be successfully defended against this and other possible objections or not, it remains an original, complex, and highly important position on the morality of terrorism. The essay presenting it is the centerpiece of Held's book and her most valuable contribution to the discussion of terrorism as far as fellow philosophers are concerned. The general reader will find much of interest in all the essays in this book. In the wider context of public debate about terrorism and the "war" against it, Held provides a strong antidote to the simplistic deliverances of "moral clarity" many of our political leaders and "public intellectuals" claim to possess.