How the Body Shapes the Mind

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Shaun Gallagher, How the Body Shapes the Mind, Oxford University Press, 2005, 284pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199271941

Reviewed by Timothy Schroeder, University of Manitoba


Calling Shaun Gallagher's new book a work of cognitive science is as irresistible as it is misleading. Misleading, because cognitive science is still -- for the most part -- a science of cognition alone, not the mind as a whole. And How the Body Shapes the Mind is not, for the most part, about cognition. But How the Body Shapes the Mind is very much an interdisciplinary work. It unifies clinical neurology, laboratory neuroscience, cognitive psychology, developmental psychology, "analytic" philosophy of mind (think Andy Clark and Dan Dennett), and "continental" philosophy of mind (think Husserl and Merleau-Ponty), all in an effort to understand certain things about the human mind that might interest both philosophers and scientists. For having this breadth of influence and scope of ambition, Gallagher's work can hardly be called anything other than cognitive science. It is cognitive science, done the way it ought to be.

How the Body Shapes the Mind is divided into two parts. Part One deals mainly with making, defending, and using a distinction between body image and body schema. Part Two deals with a selection of topics the treatment of which benefits from having the distinction of Part One firmly in hand. At least, this is the basic framework for the book. The progression of the discussion through the ten chapters that make the book up is here and there less linear than one would like it to be, and so not all of Part One really helps one get a grip on body images and body schemas, and not all of Part Two is as dependent upon Part One as might be expected. This weakness is probably the result of the book being based on a number of papers that were previously published or presented as stand-alone works. However, this minor architectural flaw does nothing to impair the philosophical or scientific interest of the work.

The broad question of How the Body Shapes the Mind is just what is suggested by the title: how, exactly, does the body shape the mind? How does it shape the mind in development, and how does it shape the current contents of the mind? Gallagher finishes with the conclusion that "nothing about human experience remains untouched by human embodiment" (p. 247), but of course some features of human experience are touched in more interesting ways than others.

The key to answering these questions, Gallagher holds, is found in the distinction between body image and body schema (chapters 1-5). Roughly, the body image is "a system of perceptions, attitudes, and beliefs pertaining to one's own body," whereas the body schema is "a system of sensory-motor capacities that function without awareness or the necessity of perceptual monitoring" (p. 24). That is, my beliefs about my body, my perceptions of my body, and my valuing or disvaluing of my body make up my body image. My body schema is something quite different. My body schema is what arranges that my hand shape itself just so in order to pick up a pencil without my paying any attention to how it is shaped, it is what tightens my back muscles and adjusts my posture when I shake hands so that I do not throw myself off balance with the movement, and so on. It operates (to a first approximation) independently of what I think or how I feel. This way of drawing the distinction is not uncontroversial, but Gallagher does a convincing job arguing that other ways of drawing the distinction -- or reasons given for not drawing it at all -- are confused or confusing.

The distinction between one's beliefs and perceptions, on the one hand, and one's body's capacity to act, on the other, will be familiar to philosophers who have followed the science of the so-called 'what' and 'where' (better: 'how') pathways in vision research. This research showed that conscious visual perception and belief were neither necessary nor sufficient for the guidance of accurate movement by the eyes. It turns out that some people with normal visual consciousness can be impaired in their ability to reach for and grasp things they can see, and that some people with damaged visual consciousness who cannot report relevant facts about the objects in front of them can nonetheless accurately reach for and grasp them. Gallagher takes this finding one step further: conscious somatosensory and proprioceptive perception and belief are neither necessary nor sufficient for guidance of movement through the world in general, any more than vision is.

The separation is made most compelling in the fascinating case of Ian Waterman (chapter 2). At the age of nineteen, Waterman lost all sense of touch and proprioception below his neck. As a result, he instantly lost the ability to control the affected parts of his body. Slowly, he regained the ability to walk, dress, eat, and so on, but in order to do these things he had to learn to do them in a new way: by alert conscious control of his every movement. Waterman must consciously adjust his balance when turning a corner, think about swinging his leg to take a step, make an effort to shape his hand into a position suited to gripping a mug if he wants to pick it up, and so on. As a result of this, he remains substantially disabled in his behavior. His case demonstrates that, while one's body schema is not strictly necessary for movement, it is necessary for movement in normal human beings and necessary for fluent movement even after extensive retraining.

Waterman is, as Gallagher puts it, a man with a body image but without a body schema. To be careful, this is not quite right. Waterman has most of his body image, but has lost his conscious senses of touch and proprioception just as he has lost the unconscious information about his body. However, some of Gallagher's other cases go some distance toward showing that conscious senses of touch and proprioception are not sufficient for accurate control over movement, and so to convincing the reader that Waterman's disabilities stem from the loss of what is unconscious (body schema), and not what is conscious (the sensory component of the body image). For my part, I was not fully convinced: Gallagher seems quick to move from the fact that information from the senses is unattended to the conclusion that it is outside of consciousness, and hence that any use made of that information is a use that does not rely on consciousness. I am more reluctant to draw this sort of conclusion, but of course here we enter a debate about the relation of attention to consciousness, and this is not where Gallagher wishes to focus his efforts.

The other chapters in Part One discuss body schema and body image as potentially innate (chapters three and four), as they relate to phantom limbs (chapter four), and as responsible for gestures (chapter five). All of these chapters are full of scientific knowledge that no naturalistic philosopher of mind should be without, and they draw conclusions that, for the most part, resist classification as purely scientific or purely philosophical.

Part Two moves on from the distinction between body image and body schema to discuss some larger phenomena that might be better understood if we understood embodiment. The issues covered include the effects of the body schema on perceptual contents (chapter 6), the Molyneux problem (chapter 7), the disorder underlying the symptoms of schizophrenia (chapter 8), our understanding of other minds (chapter 9), and free will (chapter 10). In my estimation, the chapters of Part Two are more uneven in their interest than those of Part One, but there is still much to be learned.

The discussion of the effects of the body schema on perceptual contents (chapter six) is somewhat disappointing. The chapter has a few interesting tidbits of science (apparently, whether your head is turned to the right or to the left when learning something affects how well it gets remembered -- p. 141) but some of its conclusions amount to little more than platitudes (what gets into visual consciousness is determined by where one's eyes are pointing, people who improve in coordination experience more satisfaction with their bodies), philosophical commonplaces (visual content represents spatial layout relative to one's body), or rather doubtful speculation (upright posture "brings us 'face to face' with each other, and this profoundly transforms sexuality from strict animality to something human," p. 148).

Also disappointing is the very short discussion of free will (chapter ten), which really deals with the interpretation of Benjamin Libet's famous finding that, when human subjects are given the task of moving their hands completely spontaneously, activity in the brain that predicts the spontaneous decision to move the hand builds a substantial fraction of a second before the subject is aware of making a decision. An enormous amount has been written about this subject, and Gallagher has nothing new to add to it: he takes the view that actions are generally embedded in larger contexts in which conscious decision making plays a role, and so Libet's specific results show nothing interesting about the impotence of consciousness more generally.

More interesting are the chapters sandwiched between. I particularly enjoyed the discussion of the Molyneux problem (chapter seven). Gallagher treats the science involved very carefully, and jumps to no hasty conclusions. His measured finding is that the ability to connect information from one sense modality to information from another sense modality is innate in us, but can be lost if it is not sustained through normal use. This makes sense of the fact that babies given a soother with one texture will look longer at that soother than at another presented to them at the same time but with a different texture (the babies have an innate capacity to link felt texture in their mouths to what they see, it seems; pp. 159-60) while also heeding the evidence that human beings and other animals blind from birth who have the use of their eyes restored to them later have great difficulty in using their eyes for any practical purposes at all (pp. 165-7).

The discussion of schizophrenia in the next chapter (chapter eight) is less convincing, but the phenomenon is also much more difficult to make sense of. Gallagher holds that part of the experience of acting is experiencing what one is about to do ("protention"), and argues that a key feature of schizophrenia is that schizophrenics lack this component of experience when performing certain actions. What results, according to Gallagher, is a loss of the sense of agency at those times, giving rise to feelings of external control over overt behavior and feelings of thought intrusion and hallucination in the cases of voluntary thinking and imagining, respectively. Gallagher's theory is related to others he discusses, and although it appears to improve upon them in certain respects, it stumbles upon a weakness he points out in them as well: there is no clear reason, on Gallagher's theory, why schizophrenics experience their alienation from actions and thoughts that have "crazy" characteristics and not others -- why a schizophrenic is more likely to report alienation from a thought that she is a monster than a thought that her cat did not deserve to get hit by a car, for instance. Still, the theory is interesting, and well worth considering.

In writing about our knowledge of other minds (chapter nine), Gallagher emphasizes the extent to which our explicit knowledge of other minds is built out of very primitive, pre-conceptual capacities to do things such as follow the gaze of others and to grasp their intentions and emotional stances simply by perceiving their movements, faces, and tones of voice. Keeping the importance of these capacities in mind would, he suggests, be of some value to theory theorists and simulation theorists alike, for both neglect the fact that much of our knowledge of other minds is perceptual rather than cognitive. To press the point home, he reminds us that certain high-functioning autistic people completely lack the social-perceptual capacities the rest of us take for granted, being unable to see whether someone is happy or sad, trying to cause an injury or merely being careless, and so on. Such autistic people can, nevertheless, hold sophisticated theories of mind that they can use to predict and explain behavior. But although they can do these things, they make fairly poor models for the knowledge that the rest of us have of other minds (pp. 235-6).

How the Body Shapes the Mind can be recommended for its summary of important scientific work alone, but it also does interesting things with that science. Some of what it does is develop new insights into topics that have mainly been of interest to scientists. Some of what it does is develop new insights into topics that have mainly been of interest to philosophers. And some of what it does is find brand new things for people interested in the mind to talk about, regardless of disciplinary background.