How Things Persist

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Hawley, Katherine, How Things Persist, Oxford University Press, 2001, 232pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 019924913X.

Reviewed by Heather Dyke, University of Otago


How do objects persist through change? In what sense is this chair that I am sitting in as I write this, and on which I have just spilt some coffee, the same chair that I sat in yesterday as I read Katherine Hawley’s How Things Persist? In what sense am I, the person writing this, the same person who, yesterday, was reading that book? There are, broadly speaking, currently three theories on offer to account for the persistence of ordinary objects and people. According to perdurance theory objects persist through time in much the same way as they extend through space. Today’s coffee-stained chair is the same as yesterday’s clean chair because the chair is a four-dimensional entity, part of which existed yesterday, and was clean, and another part of which exists today, and is coffee-stained. By contrast, endurance theory has it that the way objects persist through time is very different from the way they extend through space. Objects are three-dimensional, and they persist through time by being ‘wholly present’ at each time at which they exist. Today’s coffee-stained chair is the same as yesterday’s clean chair because it is numerically identical with it; there is just one chair that is ‘wholly present’ at each of the times at which it exists, and has different properties at some of those times. Recently, a new theory of persistence, stage theory, has been offered and defended (most notably by Theodore Sider, in his Four-dimensionalism, Oxford University Press, 2001). Stage theory combines elements of both its rivals. It shares perdurance theory’s commitment to a four-dimensional metaphysical framework but denies that theory’s account of predication and adopts instead something like endurance theory’s account of predication. It is not four-dimensional objects which satisfy predicates like ‘is a chair’ and which change by having some parts that are clean and some parts that are coffee-stained. Instead, it is the momentary stages that make up the four-dimensional objects which are chairs and which are clean or coffee-stained.

How Things Persist is ultimately a defense of stage theory, but it is also a study of a cluster of issues and problems in contemporary metaphysics that center on the notion of persistence. As such it would be highly suitable as a text for use in upper-level undergraduate and graduate courses in metaphysics. In chapter one, Hawley outlines the problem of persistence and the perdurance and endurance theories of it. In chapter two, she introduces stage theory, and begins to develop and defend it in response to a number of questions and potential problems. In chapter three, she presents her account of the relations responsible for making some chair-stages stages of ‘the same chair’, and some person-stages stages of ‘the same person’. These relations are non-supervenient relations, which is to say that whether or not two stages are stages of the same object is not entirely determined by the intrinsic properties of those stages. I shall return to this below. Questions about the persistence of objects often exhibit vagueness, so it is incumbent on any theory of persistence to be able to offer an account of vagueness in persistence. Hawley pits the three theories of persistence against the problem of vagueness in chapter 4. Chapter 5 examines the cluster of problems surrounding the persistence conditions of an object and of the matter that constitutes it, and chapter 6, under the heading of ‘Modality’, examines a special instance of these problems, viz., cases of complete and permanent coincidence, where an object and its constituting matter seem to differ, but only in their modal properties.

I mentioned above that this book would make a good text for upper-level undergraduate and graduate courses in metaphysics, and I wish to reinforce that observation. Unlike many monographs in metaphysics, this book is a model of clarity and crisp prose. The issues addressed in it are deep and difficult, which is one reason why there is a lack of clarity in much work in this area, but Hawley has a firm grasp of her material and a talent for relaying it in a manner that sacrifices some of its difficulty, but none of its depth. Furthermore, the way Hawley structures her discussions of the issues she tackles lends itself particularly well to use in a teaching context. The backbone of the book is the issue of persistence and the three theories of how things persist. Every other issue addressed in the book is introduced by way of how it relates to the question of persistence. So while many different topics are covered in this book, rather than being discussed in a piecemeal fashion, they are covered in a unified and cohesive manner that gives an excellent sense of an entire area in metaphysics. For example, in chapter 2, Hawley outlines the difference between stage and perdurance theories. They differ in what they take to be the things that satisfy sortal predicates and instantiate properties. Consequently, how each of them gets filled out depends on what one’s account of properties is. It is in this way that Hawley introduces the different accounts of properties.

Chapter 5 provides a nice example of the general strategy employed in this book. The three theories of persistence (endurance, perdurance and stage theory) are each pitted against the problem of the relation between an object and the matter that constitutes it and assessed on the results they yield. The problem of apparently coincident objects has a range of different responses available to it, so these are introduced and discussed by way of the three theories of persistence. For instance, one response to the question of the relation between an object and its constituting matter is to embrace the conclusion that, for example, a sweater and the thread that constitutes it are distinct objects. But this response takes on a different shape depending on whether one adopts, in conjunction with it, endurance theory or perdurance theory. According to endurance theory the two objects are distinct, share all their microphysical parts, but differ in which sortal properties they instantiate. According to perdurance theory, the two objects are distinct, share all their present microphysical parts, but differ in their past, and perhaps future, temporal parts.

Another positive feature of the book that is worth mentioning is that at the end of each chapter the implications of what was discussed in that chapter for personal persistence are worked out. Each chapter, that is, except the last. This omission is curious because there the main example under consideration throughout the second half of the chapter is one involving a person and that person’s temporal extension. Nonetheless, it is a nice touch to link the issue of the persistence of material objects with that of the persistence of persons, the two issues too often being examined in isolation from each other.

Now a few words about what I perceive to be some of the shortcomings of this book. Firstly, and perhaps least problematically, the view defended in this book is not radically new, and the book itself does not contain much that is a genuinely original and novel contribution to the field. This is not to deny that there are some innovative arguments, observations and discussions. For example, Hawley gives a novel characterization of endurance theory as “the claim that ordinary objects are such that (i) they exist at more than one time and (ii) statements about what parts they have must be made relative to some time or other” (p. 30). This is intended to capture the fundamental idea that ordinary objects exist at more than one time, but without being temporally extended. Furthermore, it permits an easy comparison with perdurance theory, which accepts (i) but rejects (ii). However, Hawley’s book is disadvantaged by the publication (in the same year and by the same publisher) of Theodore Sider’s Four-dimensionalism. While there is far from complete coincidence in the topics covered by the two books, there is some overlap, and they both offer a defense of stage theory. If I were shopping for a book on the metaphysics of time and persistence that incorporated a defense of stage theory, I have to say that I would buy Sider’s book. As a research monograph it does more to further debate on these issues than does Hawley’s book, and as a defense of stage theory it is more thorough and complete. I describe a particular instance of this below.

A more serious weakness in this book concerns the quality of Hawley’s account of the relations that bind certain series of stages together into the familiar objects that surround us. The relations in question, she claims, are non-supervenient relations. That is, they are relations, which are not wholly determined by the intrinsic properties of their relata. She gives, as an example of a non-supervenient relation, the relation of being a certain distance apart. The distance between two objects is not wholly determined by the intrinsic properties of those objects. But she then goes on to deny that the non-supervenient relations she is interested in are spatio-temporal ones. So we are frequently told what these non-supervenient relations are not, but given less of an indication as to what they are. On a close inspection of chapter 3, I unearthed the claim that the non-supervenient relations which bind stages of the ‘same’ object together are “the relations, whatever they are, which underpin the relation of ‘immanent causation’ which holds between stages of the same object, and we can pick them out by their theoretical role.” (pp. 85-86). I find this proposed account deeply unsatisfying. Saying that these relations underpin the relation of immanent causation merely restates the claim that it is intended to explain, viz., that they are relations which hold between stages of the same object. The corresponding feature of Sider’s stage theory has it that the stages that make up the ‘same’ object or person are related to each other by way of a temporal counterpart relation. While this may be somewhat counterintuitive and may be susceptible to objections, which parallel those often laid at the door of modal counterpart theory, it is at least a well developed and defended account.

Lastly, a slightly less serious worry. The last two chapters are characterized by a feeling that Hawley is simply picking her preferred account from a range of equally viable accounts. These chapters discuss the cluster of problems surrounding the apparent coincidence of objects and their constituting matter, where that coincidence is both (spatially and temporally) partial and where it is complete and permanent. Her exposition of the problems and of the alternative solutions is eminently clear, and while she draws attention to the disadvantages of the solutions that rival her own, she concedes that none of these is damaging enough to rule that account out. Now, this is partly a function of the nature of the theories on offer in this field. Typically they all seem to be viable, and which theory one opts for depends on which of our common-sense assumptions one is prepared to relinquish. This situation does not prevent one from offering arguments against the theories one thinks to be false, but Hawley does not do this. Each alternative thus remains a live option, and the reasons motivating Hawley’s choice of her favored theory have to do with explanatory power, ontological economy, and intuitive acceptability. These are admirable reasons, but they will not persuade someone who is not otherwise disposed to adopt stage theory.

Having said all that, the case Hawley makes for stage theory is, at times, a persuasive one. Its solution to cases of apparent permanent coincidence is particularly neat. What are we to say about a statue of Goliath and the lump of clay which constitutes it, as these ‘two’ things seem to have different persistence conditions even if they both exist for the same period of time? According to Hawley, the statement, “That lump of clay is Goliath” (where the name ‘Goliath’ denotes the statue), is not a statement of identity but a predicative statement ascribing the property being Goliath to that lump of clay. The predicates ‘is Goliath’, ‘is lump’, ‘is the statue’ and ‘is the lump of clay’ are all contingently co-extensional; they are all satisfied by exactly the same stages, but this might not have been the case. As Hawley says, “We are familiar with the idea that predicates may be contingently co-extensional---—predicates like ‘has a heart’ and ‘has kidneys’—and stage theory adapts this idea to handle permanent but contingent coincidence” (p. 184).

Likewise, stage theory’s approach to the question of whether an object is identical with its largest temporal part is a good one, but it seems not to differ substantially from Michael Jubien’s, whose account Hawley draws on. What are we to say about a person, such as Descartes, whom we believe might have had a longer or shorter lifetime than his actual one, and Descartes’ largest temporal part, which we intuitively think has its temporal extent essentially? Jubien believes that the world is made up of four-dimensional objects, which have their temporal boundaries essentially, and he takes a predicative approach to the proper names of ordinary objects. The statement, “That four-dimensional object is Descartes”, does not express an identity statement but attributes the property being Descartes to the four-dimensional object in question. The object in question has its temporal boundaries essentially, so it could not have spanned 55 instead of 54 years, but a different, 55-year-long object could have instantiated the property being Descartes. Hawley’s approach is to say that the predicate ‘is Descartes’ is satisfied by a certain number of stages that make up a 54-year long period, but that predicate could have been satisfied by more or by fewer stages. Hawley claims her account is different from Jubien’s, in particular because he is a perdurance theorist, and also because she admits fewer properties into her ontology. But the mechanism is the same. This is another instance of the first worry that I noted above, viz., the feeling that there is nothing substantially new on offer here, but rather a theory put together out of a selection of what is currently on offer.

My criticisms of this book mainly concern its contribution as a research monograph, but they are far from being serious objections to it. My admiration for it is based on its aptness as an upper-level text. I must emphasize that I believe its strengths firmly outweigh its weaknesses. How Things Persist is a well structured, well written, solid, crisp and lucid investigation into the cluster of metaphysical problems that surround the issue of persistence.