How to be Good: The Possibility of Moral Enhancement

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John Harris, How to be Good: The Possibility of Moral Enhancement, Oxford University Press, 2016, 195pp., $40.00, ISBN 9780198707592.

Reviewed by Daniel Moseley, The University of North Carolina at Chapel Hill


John Harris's influential work on human enhancement has strongly advocated the development, use, and exchange of human enhancement technologies. The types of enhancement that are of interest are biomedical interventions, including gene therapies, pharmaceuticals, and robotic neural implants, that are used to improve human capacities beyond what is necessary to achieve or maintain health or "normal functioning". For over thirty years, Harris has defended human enhancement projects in four books and over a hundred articles. The present volume is unique in this body of work in that it takes a more cautious stance regarding moral enhancements than he has taken toward other forms of human enhancement, such as cognitive enhancements.

Although the book purports to be a monograph, I read it as a collection of essays that explores questions that pertain to the topic of moral enhancement in ethical theory, bioethics, philosophy of law, neuroethics, and political philosophy. The book also reviews the main conclusions Harris has reached (and assumptions he has made) over decades of research in bioethics and moral, political, and legal theory. One strength of the book is that it is rich with fruitful and overlapping questions about the nature of morality and moral education. It provides a treasure chest of questions for those looking for research programs to develop on the topic. Some of the main questions Harris examines are urgent and pressing social and ethical problems. Unfortunately, the organization of the chapters seems rushed, the inquiries tend to be perfunctory and meandering, and there is much repetition. In what follows I'll examine a central line of inquiry that focuses on the nature of moral enhancement and raises the questions that I find to be most fruitful.

When taking up the topic of moral enhancement, the "first questions to ask are: what is moral enhancement and what does it have to do with ethical knowledge, if there is such a thing, or with ethical expertise; and what do all of these have to do with knowledge of ethics or morality?" (60).  Harris presents a unified answer to these questions. Starting with the last two, his arguments suggest that ethical expertise consists in being better at knowing the good (and knowing what will promote the good), and that is a matter of having sound moral judgment -- and those are "all things considered" judgments. (60) One implication of this view is that ethical experts may be horrible people. Contra Socrates, he holds that knowledge of the good is not sufficient to motivate human action: "The space between knowing the good and doing the good is a region entirely inhabited by freedom." (60) Another implication of this view is that ethical expertise may make a person more immoral, because greater knowledge of the good can provide one with the information necessary to be more effective at undermining it. Here I will register my doubts that moral knowledge is motivationally inert. Perhaps there is variation in its motivational force in different individuals. As G.M.A. Grube (1981) observes:

We are often told that in his theory Socrates ignored the will, but that is in part a misconception. The aim is not to choose the right but to become the sort of person who cannot choose the wrong and who no longer has any choice in the matter. This is what he sometimes expresses as becoming like a god, for the gods, as he puts it in the Euthyphro (10d), love the right because it is right; they cannot do otherwise and no longer have any choice at all, and they cannot be the cause of evil. (3-4)

Grube's point is discussed below. Aside from quotes from Milton, Shakespeare, and Shaw, Harris has not given an account of freedom and weakness of the will that shows that it is impossible for moral knowledge to have motivational powers.

Another approach to examining the first question "what is moral enhancement?" is to evade the theoretically challenging task of giving an account of what is moral and instead focus on particular examples that capture what matters in the debate. Thomas Douglas has examined the nature of moral enhancement by identifying ways that a biomedical enhancement may function to reduce, minimize, or eliminate "counter-moral emotions." (Douglas is not, exactly, deploying the case-based method of inquiry, but I'll set aside that issue.) He identifies two such emotions, which are discussed by Harris: (1) "a strong aversion to certain racial groups" and (2) "the impulse towards violent aggression." (61) This distinction sets up the questions: Would it be unethical for someone to use a biomedical intervention (e.g., take medication) to become less racist? (Hereafter, 'BME' will refer to biomedical moral enhancements.) Would it be unethical for someone to use BME to reduce impulsive violent aggression? Harris argues, against Douglas, that it would be unethical for someone to use (currently available) BME for these purposes. Although Harris does not think that there is anything inherently wrong with using BME in this context, his arguments are intended to focus on the current resources that we have available for serving as BME. (77)

On the topic of reducing racism with BME, he argues that racism usually has cognitive content that is based on false factual claims -- it is likely to be based on false beliefs about racial groups or drawing inferences about them via overgeneralization from particular cases. (61) He adds, "The most obvious countermeasure to false beliefs and prejudices is a combination of rationality and education, possibly assisted by various other forms of cognitive enhancement, in addition to courses or sources of education and logic." (62) To be clear, he is not saying that the use of biomedical enhancement technology would always be problematic. He endorses the use of cognitive enhancements (although he is not specific about which ones). However, he does not endorse the use of BME that would directly target racist motives that are not rationally evaluable. One objection that he considers is from his friends Ingmar Persson and Julian Savulescu (hereafter, 'P&S'). They contend that racism may need to be physiologically circumvented (with BME) because homo sapiens have evolved to encode for the race of each individual that they encounter via automated computational processes. According to P&S, this racial encoding mechanism evolved to detect coalitional alliances. Harris's response to P&S's argument is worth quoting at length:

Racism still remains widespread, but is almost everywhere deplored, and in many countries is also against the law. And of course it is racist behavior, not racist beliefs that are the problem, or the main problem. The most important thing about the prejudices that most, perhaps all of us, have in one form or another, is to recognize them and learn to be ashamed of them and above all not to act on them. The neutralization of the worst effects of racist beliefs is thus probably enhanced by cognitive enhancement. Moreover, it seems likely that racism affects, in a virulent form, only a minority of the world's population, and yet all of us have the encoding, so one might think the encoding cannot be that powerful. Racism has further reduced dramatically in the last hundred years by forms of moral enhancement including education, public disapproval, knowledge acquisition, and legislation. We thus have a very effective blueprint for the sorts of ways in which we can reduce and hopefully eventually effectively eradicate racism. (62)

In an uncharacteristic lapse of evidence for his empirical claims, Harris's forecast on the future of racism seems naïvely optimistic. The increases in authoritarianism across the globe and, in America, the national rallies and increased political activity and influence of emboldened racists raises pressing concerns about how to reduce, minimize, or eliminate racism. The call for more cognitive enhancements does not seem plausible. The racial encoding hypothesis of P&S raises the possibility that racism may biologically entrenched in human nature, but the use of BME to solve the problem does not seem promising. It is good to be aware of our potentials biases in figuring out how to deal with them. The old-fashioned methods of addressing racism that Harris suggests seem a better use of our limited resources. The focus on education, public disapproval, knowledge acquisition, and legislation seem a step in the right direction. However, in order to make progress in the reduction of racism and other types of bigotry it would be helpful to develop specific blueprints and action plans for using each of the tools that Harris mentions. These are immensely challenging but urgent tasks.

In addressing the second question on whether it would be unethical for someone to use BME for reducing impulsive violence, Harris argues that the current BMEs on the market are not suited for moral improvement. Given that the class of psychiatric medications that are commonly suggested to serve as the relevant BME manipulate levels of serotonin or oxytocin, Harris argues that these drugs may produce "pro-social" behaviors (that is, behaviors that would be considered morally acceptable to observers) but the behavior would not be motivated by the moral judgments of the individuals taking these drugs. In a telling passage, he contends that these drugs act like "a deep-seated irrational prejudice, like racism, sexism, or speciesism. It clouds judgment, making the subject much less able to choose rationally and weigh alternatives from a moral perspective." (79) There is a tension between his earlier discussion of racism as an immoral belief and the comparison that he makes here between deep-seated irrational prejudices and using physiological causal interventions to influence judgment. If racism influences judgment in the same way that psychiatric medications do, then there is a non-doxastic dimension to racism that Harris was unwilling to countenance earlier. In my own view, racism has emotional, doxastic, and other social and psychological dimensions that are completely ignored in this discussion. (However, I do agree with Harris that we should take a precautionary stance regarding the use of the current armory of BME to combat racism. Doctors should not be prescribing psychiatric drugs to treat racism.) To return to the issue of whether it would be unethical for someone to use an BME to curtail their own impulsive violence, Harris's argument seems to be that although a person who is using an BME may behave in a manner that accords with the dictates of correct moral judgment, that person's freedom would be undermined by doing so and that would be wrong. For Harris, the freedom to do immoral things is at risk and that freedom has central importance to our well-being.

Another landmark in Harris's broad discussion of freedom and moral enhancement is his take on the God Machine thought experiment of P&S. The scenario discusses the possibility of eliminating all immoral actions. In the not so distant future, an almost omniscient and extremely powerful machine is created that monitors the thoughts, beliefs, desires, and intentions of all people. The machine is capable of modifying these within nanoseconds. It can intervene in all of these psychological states without being consciously detected by the people that are subjected to these interventions. The God Machine is designed to give human beings nearly complete freedom. It only intervenes to prevent immoral behavior from occurring. As soon any anyone forms a bad intention (say, the intention to murder someone), the God Machine would intervene and the subject of the intervention would just suddenly change their mind. P&S contend that in the world of The God Machine people have all of the freedom that anyone should want.

Harris defends the value of the freedom to do what is immoral with three main lines of argument. First, he maintains that the God Machine would not be able to distinguish justified and unjustified acts of violence. He suspects that the God Machine might prevent a woman from performing a Caesarean section on herself with a kitchen knife in emergency circumstances or it might stop an amateur performing emergency tracheotomy surgery at roadside. He uses these examples and other considerations to make the case that moral judgments are holistic in a manner that makes them resistant to BME technologies and the God Machine: "context is hugely important and context is not accessible to the God Machine or even (often) to God herself." (103) Of course, if the God Machine was omniscient, it would be able to determine whether the attempts would be justified or not and consider all of the relevant considerations. Why would Harris doubt that? Given Harris's own endorsement of strong duties of rescue, it is hard to see why he thinks that the freedom to do what is immoral is so important in these cases. (This tension is similar to the one that Mill faces between his endorsement of both the principle of utility and the fundamental value of autonomy.) Second, he argues that living under the reign of the God Machine is to live under a slave-owning tyrant. Even if you were able to choose whether to live under the reign of the God Machine, "The freedom to sell yourself into slavery is, with few exceptions, admitted to be the one exercise of liberty incompatible with the very liberty of which it is claimed to be an instance." (106) A compelling point. Third, he rhetorically asks, "But who would guard the guardians? How would the operations of this new megalomaniac be regulated, challenged, or even reviewed?" (105) These concerns about ideological contamination in the programming of the God Machine are on target. P&S do not claim that the God Machine is omni-benevolent, and that is part of what makes it terrifying.

I pose another problem for Harris's account of the value of freedom. Consider Grube's reading of Socrates: a virtuous person becomes like a god in the sense that she cannot choose what is wrong. According to this view, knowledge of the good is rare and it shields its possessor from temptation because the virtuous person loves the good and knows what it demands. If this is possible, then a person who has achieved this form of knowledge (and high level of virtue) is not free to do what is wrong, but the loss of that freedom in no way undermines the well-being of that person. In fact, the loss of that freedom is part of what constitutes that individual's well-being and it does not seem to make the person's conduct any less praiseworthy. This conception of the sage's wisdom is prevalent cross-culturally in many spiritual traditions. It would be a more interesting topic for future discussion than the God Machine.

This review has discussed a mere sliver of the enormous helping of interesting arguments served in Harris's short book. It also contains a defense of his version of objective-list consequentialism and strong duties of rescue. He also argues that we should abandon the phrase "human rights" because it suggests that species membership is the basis of moral rights. He also argues for rejecting the idea of species barriers in a defense of the need for interspecies constructs, i.e., "humanimals." Another chapter defends a Hobbesian version of the social contract theory. In sum, the book is intended for bad people, because as he says, and argues, "Ethics is for Bad Guys!"


I would like to thank Eric Juengt and Ryan Johnson (and the Philosollamas of Elon University) for helpful discussions, and Dana Falkenberg and Brian Powell for feedback on an earlier draft.


Grube, G.M.A., tr. and commentary (1981), "Introduction to Euthyphro, Apology, Crito," Plato, Five Dialogues, Hackett.