How to Do Philosophy with Words: Reflections on the Searle-Derrida debate

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Jesús Navarro, How to Do Philosophy with Words: Reflections on the Searle-Derrida debate, John Benjamins, 2017, 225pp., $158.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789027218964.

Reviewed by Samuel C. Wheeler III, University of Connecticut


This is the second[1] book-length discussion of a confrontation between Jacques Derrida and John Searle, which consisted of an essay by Derrida[2] focusing on J. L. Austin's How to Do Things with Words,[3] Searle's critique of Derrida's essay[4], and Derrida's very long reply to that critique.[5] This encounter, which occurred roughly forty years ago, has become a kind of emblem of the divide between analytic and continental philosophy. The confrontation has been widely discussed, and is worth studying by analytic philosophers who are open to the idea that Derrida's work might be interesting.

This book is sometimes irritating, sometimes wrong, sometimes jargonized, but sometimes very insightful and illuminating. Navarro is at his best when discussing the particular texts in question. His larger-scale expositions of the background and history of the thinkers are often not satisfying. A philosopher reading the book has to put up with some shortcomings, but there are rewards. I learned quite a bit on topics I thought I understood pretty well. Someone with views on the debate will have a lot to think about. This review will consist of chapter-by-chapter remarks.

Chapter 1, on Austin: These seventeen pages try to cover a lot, placing Austin in the history of twentieth century philosophy as well as describing his account of speech acts. The central topic is "context," the circumstances required for an utterance to be a successful speech act of a given kind. A critical question in the whole book is that of "saturation," whether the contextual requirements for being a promise, for instance, can be completed or conclusively known to be completed. In his summary of the chapter, Navarro writes:

After a careful analysis of the pragmatic implications of the illocutionary act, it seems to me that the question of force has ended up collapsing back into the question of truth: in order that the area of illocutionary force function, Austin said, it is necessary that certain utterances be true. We could even say that it is sufficient that certain utterances be true, meaning that pragmatics would fall back into semantics. (p. 34)

Stanley Fish thinks Austin means "necessary and sufficient;" Judith Butler, et al. favor a more "open-ended" notion. No references are given for the relevant passages in Fish or Butler.

I would guess that "open ended" means recognizing that no set of rules covers every new situation, just as the Torah does not settle whether continuing to back up one's hard drive is working.

In any case, to give any content to the question of "necessary and sufficient conditions" requires specification of the terms in which those conditions are to be stated. At one extreme, "'is a promise' is true of an utterance u if and only if u is a promise" gives necessary and sufficient conditions. At another extreme would be sense-datum reports. I am not sure the question of "necessary and sufficient conditions" is the one to ask.

Derrida's critique on the surface is that, whereas Austin claims to advance beyond making a promise depend on an interior state of the promiser, the analysis turns out to require beliefs and desires. These propositional attitudes themselves have syntactic structure, and barring Husserlian intentional objects, are represented as iterable sequences. So they would require interpretation in context. "Saturation" of context would thus require conditions that are "determinable" in not appealing to intentional states. Whether there are necessary and sufficient conditions if intentional predicates are allowed in the conditions is thus beside the point.

Chapter 2, on Searle, is accurate and insightful. Navarro is careful to emphasize Searle's notion of "background," a notion which, as Navarro explains later, makes the distance between Derrida and Searle very small.

Chapter 3, on Derrida's philosophical background, is less satisfactory. Much of the discussion of figures will be of little help to anyone not already familiar with the figures discussed. A useful supplement to Nietzsche's notion of "force" and its use would be a brief comparison to the analytic notion of "force" versus propositional content as Frege used it, since Nietzschean force is critical in later sections of the book. Austin's idea, in part, is to make force part of content, for some utterances.

Navarro claims that, in order to talk about Nietzsche, Marx, Heidegger, Levinas, and Derrida's positions "little by little my own discourse has had to mimic the style of Derrida in order to make room for the unfolding of his thought." To wit, "The vagueness in the structuring of arguments, the personalization of ideas over the course of the narrative", etc. A skeptic would ask why Derrida's thought requires so much room, where Kant and other well-regarded thinkers can be accommodated in smaller linguistic corridors. And if we allow that Husserl, Habermas, and Foucault are "Continental Philosophers", those needing more room are a subset of the "Continentals".

Navarro's excuse is also unfair to Derrida, who is not vague. Admittedly, some of Derrida's writings are difficult,[6] but others are quite accessible. Derrida's discussion of Husserl is about as clear as one could hope. Derrida is not just "suspicious" about Husserl's views, as Navarro says (pp 69-70). Rather, he has an argument, actually a classic deconstruction. According to Husserl himself, the notion of presence essentially contains a now absent past and a now absent future. To experience something as present thus essentially involves what is not present. That's an argument that Chisholm could have made. Navarro only says that Derrida is "suspicious" of presence as Husserl presents it. Another example of accessible Derrida would be "White Mythology," one of the really great twentieth century works on metaphor.

The discussion of Saussure misrepresents historical linguistics and Saussure's attitude toward it. Saussure explicitly recognizes the scientific achievements in Indo-European linguistics in his characterization of what linguistics should be. Franz Bopp et al. were not engaged in "the search, within the etymology of the term, for the motive that makes the linguistic association necessary and not merely arbitrary" (p. 71). Rather they were constructing the basic definitive account of systematic changes resulting in different Indo-European language groups. Saussure said there was something else for linguistics to describe besides how consonants changed in Slavic versus in Germanic, etc.

Chapter 4 is an exposition of "Signature, Event, Context." A difficulty with Austin's account of speech acts, according to Navarro, citing other sources, is that Austin's necessary conditions, since they cannot be extended to be made sufficient, mean that we never have "complete" speech acts (p. 92). This is baffling. The fact that I do not have an account of necessary and sufficient conditions for being a warning does not mean that there is any room for reasonable doubt that "Watch out!" on a particular occasion is a warning. In the same way, I know Fred is a chicken without having access to necessary and sufficient conditions for being a chicken, other than the Tarskian-Davidsonian "Is a chicken" is true of an entity a if and only if a is a chicken." The chickens themselves each meet the necessary and sufficient conditions for being a chicken, even though no matter how much information about them I had (in other terms, than the predicate "chicken,") there would be some possibility that I was wrong.

Navarro later mentions Searle's conjecture that the worries about "completeness" and "saturation" confuse epistemological and ontological conditions. A "complete act," though, might be understood as follows: Derrida is supposing that meanings would be Husserlian, something like Platonic Forms, entities that somehow determined for every possible case whether an entity fell under a predicate or not. David Lewis' properties would be such entities. On that conception, the difficulty is how a consciousness would refer to one of those properties. That is, how could I really have "being a chicken" before my mind? "Presence" would do the job, if a conscious state could single out either a unique set of possible worlds or its Husserlian equivalent. But if thought is language-like, in being repeatable, iterable tokens without an essential relation to those ideas, then there would always be a gap between a thought or utterance and the proposition it expresses. Meanwhile many analytic philosophers, both Wittgensteinian and Quinean (and Searle and Austin), had abandoned that traditional notion of meaning.

Chapter 5, primarily on Searle's reply, begins with an exposition of the reception of Derrida in the US that is just mistaken. The Yale Critics were not reacting against criticism that looked outside the text to psychology, the poet's personal experience, etc. Rather, they had been trained in the light of the New Criticism, (John Crowe Ransome, Cleanth Brooks, et al.) who showed how poems were coherent textual works of art. The reaction by Geoffrey H. Hartman, Harold Bloom, et al. was against the idea that interpretations should exhibit coherence, rather than internal conflict. New Critics and the Yale Critics agreed in focusing on the text itself.

Once Navarro himself focuses on the text itself, the discussion is very good. His discussion of Searle exhibits how much of the mutual misunderstanding rests on mutual ignorance. Derrida knows nothing of Searle's nuanced account of intentionality and his notion of background; Searle does not see that Derrida is attacking a Husserlian notion of what "meaning" would be.

Chapter 6 is on "Limited Inc." Navarro does a valiant job of commentary on a long, not-easy-to-follow piece, sorting out the rhetoric and the argument. Sometimes he missteps. An important passage is on the question whether iterability, the fact that any token can occur in contexts where it would mean something different, affects the very possibility of theory. After quoting Derrida (Limited Inc, pp. 69-70) Navarro explicates:

Every theory must be expressed in a language; the problem appears when, in addition to being formulated in a language, a theory seeks to take over language itself. This is the absurd pretension of speech act theory, which seeks to pull itself up by its own bootstraps.

This is not a good argument, given post-Tractarian logical theory. I would be reluctant to attribute it to Derrida. A metalanguage can prove theorems about an object language. Why can't a language using speech acts and (of course) iterable tokens prove theorems about speech acts? "All English sentences use words" is a true, if limited, theory. Sentences applying non-semantic predicates to themselves are not a problem.

But a general theory of speech acts is arguably semantic. So there might be a problem with a general theory of speech acts, given that the theory would cover all speech acts. Such a theory might require a universal truth-predicate. That is, a theory of speech acts would be written as assertions, committing the writer to their truth. This argument would need to be developed, but could lie behind Derrida's intuition that something is amiss in the notion of a general theory of speech acts.

Another argument Navarro gives, that there is a problem with idealization because extending the model of the natural sciences to the human sciences requires metaphorical extension, also needs filling-out. The final section, on idealizations as fictions, is unpersuasive:

Imagine that it is a normal person, and not a literary character, that performs the speech act. In order that there be a single correct interpretation of the character . . . somebody would have to be able to determine all of the elements of the context, both external and internal . . . (p. 136)

That is, there are no correct interpretations of anything anyone says. This again (see the discourse on chickens, above) confuses being able to identify cases with having a non-trivial algorithm for determining cases. That there might sometimes be a question whether "Fasten your seat belts" is a command does not mean that there always or even usually is a question. If interpreting "Fasten your seat belts" required that one could pick out the set of possible worlds in which the flight attendant would be satisfied that you had obeyed, that is, the set of possible events that would be fastening one's seat belt according to the flight attendant's concept, conclusive interpretation would be impossible. But it does not, so it is not.

Chapter 7 discusses the aftermath of the confrontation, and sorts out what went wrong. The sorting-out is the most persuasive and valuable part of the book. Briefly, both Derrida and Searle wrongly attribute views to their opponent. Navarro seems to me to be quite fair, and insightful.

Chapter 8 discusses the relevance of speech act theory to philosophy itself. After all, philosophical texts themselves are writings which may have different intentions. A writing may be intended to "Seduce- Convince- Naturalize a phenomenon . . . Ground, defend, interpret, vindicate, discredit" (p. 166) for instance. But agreement and disagreement require assertion. A simple example: Three subjects -- A, B, and C -- perform three speech acts with identical illocutionary content, but a different illocutionary force. A: "Marcus is closing the door."; B: 'Marcus, close the door.'; C: "Hopefully, Marcus is closing the door.". Does it make sense to ask whether A, B, and C are in agreement, taking into consideration only the content expressed in these utterances?

A lot has gone wrong here. The intentions of a philosophical writing may be carried out with assertions, even though it is an attempted seduction. Something would be wrong with "I hereby seduce you by saying . . . " Not every intention has a different illocutionary force, even granted that there is no sharp line between illocution and perlocution. Making tenure more likely is not a mode of philosophical writing.

The subsequent discussion of Derrida's rhetoric is well worth reading. It does not really bear on speech act theory, but will help the reader of "Limited Inc" see what was going on.

The last chapter draws conclusions about the nature of philosophy based on the preceding chapters. The topics are "the unity of philosophy" and "Whither philosophy?" The most interesting part of the chapter, though, is the return to the discussion of Searle's Chinese Room, which becomes a model for what must supplement Saussurean structuralism. A system solely of differences without some content to the entities that are different would be something akin to the purely syntactic operations in the room. A great deal more than computation or structures of difference is going on in organisms, and intentionality depends on it. Neither Searle nor Derrida hold that anything like Husserlian or Platonic meanings are involved.

[1] The first was Raoul Moati, Derrida/Searle Deconstruction and Ordinary Language, Columbia University Press 2014. Reviewed in this journal in 2014.

[2] Derrida, Jacques, "Signature, Event, Context." First published in English in Glyph 1, Johns Hopkins University Press, 1977, pp. 172-197.

[3] Austin, J. L., How to Do Things with Words, Oxford University Press, 1962.

[4] Searle, John, "Reiterating the Differences: A Reply to Derrida," Glyph 1, Johns Hopkins University Press, 1977, pp.198-208.

[5] Derrida, Jacques. "Limited Inc." Glyph 2, Johns Hopkins University Press, pp.162-256.

[6] The difficulty is akin to that of Finnegan's Wake. Vagueness is not the issue.