How to Do Science with Models: A Philosophical Primer

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Axel Gelfert, How to Do Science with Models: A Philosophical Primer, Springer, 2016, $54.99, 135pp., ISBN 9783319279527.

Reviewed by Arnon Levy, The Hebrew University of Jerusalem


Models and modeling have occupied an outsized role in recent philosophy of science. The reasons are not hard to see. On the one hand, models are widespread across a range of scientific disciplines, from elementary physics through different parts of biology to the social sciences. On the other hand, they stand at the intersection of a number of key philosophical topics. Some are classic philosophy of science topics, such as the nature of explanation and the viability of realism (Bokulich, 2011; Levy forthcoming). Given the ubiquity of models and given that they are often idealized, abstract and/or independent of "big" theories, questions concerning how a model can explain and what we may learn from models about reality take on a new -- and, some would say, urgent -- form. Modeling also raises new(ish) questions about the nature of scientific representation: how can an idealized and abstract model represent the world? Does model-based representation work similarly to other kinds of representation, within or without science?

Axel Gelfert's concise monograph is an attempt to both survey central themes from philosophical writing on modeling and, at the same time, offer novel ideas about how models work and the ways in which model-based science is distinctive. This is an ambitious effort, especially for such a short book. It is met with a substantial, though not full, measure of success. Shortcomings can largely be traced to the gap between its ambition and its length.

The book can be divided into three rough parts. Chapters 1 surveys work on the nature and metaphysics of models, and Chapter 2 does the same for work on representation. Chapter 3 discusses several case studies, illustrating the issue of tradeoffs in modeling, but also laying the ground for discussions in later chapters. The final two chapters offer more novel contributions, looking at exploratory uses of models and arguing for an extension (in a sense, a refinement) of the "models as mediators" framework (Morgan and Morrison, 1999). Let me look at these in turn and then offer some general remarks.

The first chapter traces some historical antecedents of the current concepts of a model. It notes that models were originally construed quite narrowly as concrete devices associated with visualization and mechanical manipulation. It then traces the notion of model as it emerged within the so-called semantic view of theories in the 1960s and 70s. Like many other elements of modern philosophy of science, this notion arose largely as a reaction to logical positivism, and in particular its appeal to a syntactic conception of theories. Gelfert then offers a pair of helpful distinctions: first between models viewed as instantiations of a (typically formal) theory, i.e., as playing a role akin to the role of models in logic and proof theory, versus models as a means of representing, i.e. serving as a guide to or standing in for, a target in the natural world. The second distinction occurs within views of the representational stripe: one kind of account treats model-based representation informationally, i.e., as grounded in some objective relation between model and target, like (qualitative) similarity or a formal mapping. The second kind of account treats representation pragmatically, i.e., in terms of what it allows a user of the model to do to draw various kinds of inferences, to apply a theory, etc. As can be gleaned from the book's title, Gelfert's sympathies lay with the pragmatic view. But he surveys other views fairly and with care.

The first chapter then looks at some issues connected with the ontology of models, in particular the recent suggestion that models are ontologically on a par with fictions, and the attempt to ground models in the popular pretense-based account of fiction, best known from the work of Kendall Walton (Walton, 1990; see also Currie, 1990). The writing, here and later in the book, is admirably clear and the amount of material covered quite impressive. But the overall arc of the chapter is a little confusing. While the historical material certainly serves as an illuminating backdrop to the remainder of the book, the portion engaging with the ontology of models is somewhat short and incomplete (options other than the fictions view, and the idea that models are primarily material, are not given sufficient space) and I had some doubts as to how it supported the arguments later in the book.

Chapter 2 zeroes in on the topic of representation. It begins by arguing that models represent in a way that is continuous with representation in other domains, but also distinctive. The main contrast here is with views that regard model-based representation as just another instance of representation in general (Cohen and Callender, 2005), and the perhaps more widespread, but less clearly argued for, view of models as sui generis kinds of representations. If I understand him correctly, Gelfert accepts that models share key features with other representational devices -- primarily, something like denotation, or some such intentional element of "aboutness". But he also thinks that models are special, inasmuch as they represent in ways that uniquely shape inquiry and afford specific kinds of epistemic access to target phenomena.

Having established a general sympathy for the idea that models represent in a distinctive yet not wholly sui generis way, the remainder of chapter 2 largely explores the dichotomy between informational and pragmatic views of model-based representation, aiming to delineate and illuminate various options, rather than arguing for a view. The main contrast drawn is between two views. One is R.I.G. Hughes' (1997) DDI view on which a model consists of three steps or elements: denotation, demonstration and interpretation. The other is the more deflationary inferential view, due primarily to Mauricio Suarez (2004), on which a model represents by conducing to correct inferences about its target. Gelfert recounts the positions, and their pros and cons, with admirable clarity, and though he officially remains neutral, his heart seems closer to the inferential view, with its pragmatic-deflationary character. The final portion of this chapter deals very briefly with some issues concerning realism and models. This is a large and complicated issue, and the attempt to both give a comprehensive survey and write a succinct monograph has led Gelfert to over-reach, it seems. To my mind it would have been better for the overall coherence of this chapter to leave this issue aside.

Chapter 3 discusses strategies, primarily via looking at three case studies: the first is models of super-conductivity, in particular the Landau-Ginzburg approach versus the so-called "microscopic" BCS model; the second is the Hubbard model of conduction/insulation in solids; and the third is the Lotka-Volterra model of predator-prey dynamics. By looking at these cases, Glefert aims:

to steer a middle path between conceiving of model-based science as a unitary strategy of scientific theorizing and distinguishing between different discipline-specific strategies of model-building. The underlying methodological assumption in what follows is that it is possible to identify a 'middle range' of recurring strategies that cut across different scientific disciplines (43).

Such strategies include phenomenological modeling, which aims to capture the phenomena in a simple and predictive way, in contrast to more "mechanistic" or "microscopic" models, which aim to depict underlying structure more realistically. But Gelfert also notes the importance of dedicated formalisms in modeling. This is one of the book's original contributions that receives more attention in a later chapter, and I will discuss it in that context. Overall, the third chapter manages to impressively combine a discussion of cases with a more abstract delineation of relevant strategies. Space constraints are still felt, but less acutely than in previous chapters that were devoted to surveying larger and more complex literatures.

The final two chapters, as noted, contain the book's most original contributions. They are highly interesting, containing some novel and even exciting suggestions. Some of these suggestions have appeared in Gelfert's earlier writing, but they are brought together and placed in context here. The forth chapter develops the notion that models often play an exploratory role (indeed, multiple exploratory roles.) The fifth and final chapter clarifies and develops the "models as mediators" outlook, which originates with Mary Morgan and Margaret Morrison (1999). It seems to me that there are two main drawbacks to this part of the book. The first is the order of chapters. It would have probably made more sense to first develop the models-as-mediators framework and then provide an account of model-based exploration within that framework. The second is that, here as before, space constraints prevent the text from fully delivering on the promise of its central ideas.

The notion of exploratory models is one of those notions that is both very natural, and yet has not been discussed at length, and has rarely even been explicitly articulated. Gelfert outlines three central forms of exploration. The first is proof of concept, i.e. showing that a certain kind of process, mechanism or structure can give rise to a phenomenon of interest; this is akin to a common practice in engineering where a certain type of design is shown to be in principle suitable to a designated task. The second is the generation of potential explanations, i.e. showing how a given theory can be applied to a particular phenomenon (Gelfert relies to this end on Nancy Cartwright's "simulacrum" account of explanation.) The third is delineating the target -- i.e. deciding what range of phenomena a given model is best suited for. Doubts can be raised about whether all three modes of inquiry are exploratory, in the ordinary sense. Doesn't proof-of-concept, at least often, proceed in a hypothesis-driven manner? That is, isn't it often an attempt to corroborate a certain hypothesis (model of type x can account for phenomena of type y)? A similar question can be asked about the notion of generating potential explanations. It is likely that Gelfert has devoted some thought to these matters, and could offer some responses and clarification, but he hardly does so in the short span of this chapter. That is regrettable, as the ideas are well worth more in-depth analysis.

Finally, there is the development of the models-as-mediators view. To my mind, this view has always been, on the one hand, suggestive and intuitively "on to" something, and, on the other hand, somewhat vague and unclear. Morgan and Morrison formulated the view largely in contrast to the idea of models as a means for applying a theory to a given problem. The mediation view, and the associated idea that models are "autonomous," highlights the fact that models often draw on non-theoretical sources, both data and "extra" theoretic tools and assumptions. Gelfert does not justify the choice of this framework to begin with, which is understandable, given the brevity of the chapter, but is in some ways regrettable. But he does make a significant effort to clarify the mediation view. He argues that the notions of mediation and autonomy can be given a sense that is broader and less directly tied to the idea that models sit "mid-way" between theory and data, which was an idea that drove the framework's initial development.

One idea he highlights in this regard is that of a mature mathematical formalism -- "an integrated and entrenched system of rules and conventions for the manipulation of various symbols and terms, which are typically expressed in the language of mathematics and interpreted in accordance with a set of theoretical and methodological commitments" (104). Such formalisms, he argues, impose on the model (strictly speaking, the modeler) structure that both opens up opportunities and imposes constraints on it use. The formalism thereby guides work with (and on) the model, and in this sense endows it with a measure of autonomy.[1] Gelfert also draws on a distinction from the philosophy of technology (especially, from the work of Don Ihde) between embodied and hermeneutic uses of a tool -- those that function almost as parts of our bodies (like glasses) versus those that require active interpretation (like a compass). He suggests that models can function in either way, depending on their structure and on the representational context, both in relation to targets and to other models.

Overall, this is a very well written and engaging book. It embraces a broadly pragmatic attitude towards modeling, insightfully highlighting the role of models in exploration and the way in which a model's formal structure can shape and constrain inquiry.

The book's main drawbacks, as noted, flow from the attempt to occupy a middle ground between a survey and a piece of original research. Given its length, this is virtually impossible to do. One consequence is that some central assumptions are not justified (like the embrace of the models-as-mediators approach, or the assumption of Cartwright's unorthodox view of explanation). Another is that the novel ideas, for instance those concerning exploratory modeling, remain insufficiently developed.

That said, the book is well worth reading and thinking about for philosophers of science in general and for those working on models in particular. It manages to skillfully cover a lot of material in a small amount of space, and it presents several novel and fruitful ideas. I, for one, will surely re-read large parts of it in the future, and will likely assign parts of it to students in relevant courses. And I look forward to the author's continued exploration of models and modeling.


Bokulich, Alisa (2011), How Scientific Models can Explain, Synthese, 180(1): 33-45.

Currie, Gregory (1990), The Nature of Fiction, Cambridge University Press.

Godfrey-Smith, Peter (2006), The Strategy of Model Based Science, Biology & Philosophy, 21(5): 283-299.

Hughes, R.I.G. (1997), Models and Representation, Philosophy of Science, 64(4): S325-336.

Levy, Arnon (forthcoming), Models and Realism: Strange Bedfellows? In, Juha Saatsi, (ed.), Routledge Handbook on Scientific Realism.

Morgan, Mary and Margaret Morrison (Eds., 1999), Models as Mediators: Perspectives on Natural and Social Science, Cambridge University Press.

Suarez, Mauricio (2004), An Inferential Conception of Scientific Representation, Philosophy of Science, 71(5): 767-779.

Walton, Kendall (1990), Mimesis as Make-Believe, Harvard University Press.

[1] An interesting analogy can be drawn with various forms of constrained writing, i.e. novels and poems that are written under formal rules. A well-known example is The Void, by French novelist George Perec, which contains no instances of the letter ‘e’. Perec has spoken about the creative opportunities opened up by this self-imposed formal constraint. (He has also written a novel containing only the vowel ‘e’, joking that he had find a use for the many left over ‘e’s).