How to Do Things with Pornography

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Nancy Bauer, How to Do Things with Pornography, Harvard University Press, 2015, 211pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674055209.

Reviewed by Nellie Wieland, California State University, Long Beach


You might assume that this book is an entry into the philosophical debates about pornography, speech and silencing, and feminist views on the same. But that's not what it's doing at all. In Chapter 7, in her assessment of the source of philosophical authority, Nancy Bauer intimates that philosophy, as a discipline, is in real danger of "succumbing to the temptations of smugness and self-petrifaction" (118). Speech act analyses of pornography are just an example used by Bauer to illustrate what can go wrong when philosophers fail to consider what they are doing with language and with philosophical inquiry itself.

There is quite a range in this compact volume: hookup culture, Simone de Beauvoir on self-objectification, a complete analysis of Lars and the Real Girl, and a compellingly contrarian reading of J.L. Austin on illocutionary force -- as examples. Yet this all comes together in a rich and rewarding collection. Each of the essays can be read on its own, but it is advisable that they be read together as each unexpectedly deepens the possibilities for learning from the others. I will discuss only some of Bauer's projects, beginning with what I take to be of  most general interest and working toward her more specialized arguments. This does not follow the trajectory of the book; however, readers will find that the book likewise circles in on arguments rather than proceeding stepwise.

Bauer does not actually say that philosophy is smug and self-petrified. Rather, she says that avoiding smugness and self-petrification is what Socrates wanted for the philosopher. While philosophy can "redirect the soul's sight" (118), it can only do so insofar as philosophers are speaking about the world as it is actually experienced. A recurring theme of Bauer's is that philosophers fail to do this in much of their current work and misinterpret historical work as existing outside of what is an inherently ethical commitment to get the world right.

In addition to getting the world right, philosophers need to be able to speak about the world authoritatively. When a philosopher gives an account of something there should be a justification for thinking she has the authority to do so. The natural justification (one I feel uneasy denying is not only correct but the only way to be correct) is that reason itself authorizes her speech. The authority of the philosopher derives from the force of reason. And what is this? This is not meant to be disingenuous; the force of reason is pretty clearly something like correct descriptions of reality (or realities or perspectives or ideas, and so on) held together with principles of good thinking. And why not? That's where we claim to be speaking from if nowhere else.

And what do we accomplish when we speak reasonably, as philosophers? This is more interesting, yet it is a distant second in terms of our concerns. The description of the philosopher's accomplishment is pretty much assumed to be the same thing. Our speech is authorized by the force of reason and our accomplishment is the pursuit of reason. Why, really, should we care about anything other than this most important accomplishment? Bauer's rejoinder is not as flat-footed as pointing to the practical concerns of academic life, the culture of the bureaucratic university, or the value of 'public' philosophy. Her target is a more fundamental investigation of the methods of philosophy and whether the words we use when we do philosophy mean what we think they mean. But this orientation toward the pursuit of reason is in fact at odds with our philosophical authority. Philosophical speech, like all speech, is granted or denied authority in the ongoing exchange with anybody to whom it might be directed (20). Bauer says that philosophical speech risks becoming (and too often becomes) effete and thereby insensitive to its own power (117). At this point one might wonder whose speech Bauer is considering. Her point is well-taken for the author of a prestigious research article; it is less so for the bulk of philosophers whose primary labor consists of engaging introductory students.

This brings us to what the title suggests at least some of the book will be about: Austin's familiar analysis of illocutionary force. Despite the thoroughgoing and wide-ranging exploitation of Austin's insights in How to Do Things with Words within and outside of the discipline of philosophy, Bauer thinks we have done an abysmal job, as philosophers, in bothering to understand the force of philosophical speech. A standard reading of Austin's important project in How to Do Things with Words is that he introduced a taxonomy of speech that made clear the ways in which some speech is a species of action. As such, a complete account of the meaning of certain speech acts -- performatives, at least -- requires that we account for what that speech does. This standard reading has had at least two deleterious effects according to Bauer: Austin has been regarded as a forefather of a wholly distinct branch of linguistic study, pragmatics, and the (mere) analysis of illocutionary force has been used to show how some speech in itself harms people.

Bauer's reading of Austin's rejection of pragmatics as an independent branch of linguistics deserves a far more extended treatment than can be given here -- both as exegesis of Austin and as an argument for the correct way to conceive of language. A sense of what she has in mind is that Austin's book ought to be read as a kind of reductio of the very project in which most readers take him to be engaged. When he appears to propose that there are distinct levels of linguistic analysis -- some of which reveal the literal meaning of a sentence, others the pragmatic force of that same sentence as uttered in a context -- he does it only as an exercise to show that this will never work. At the very least, he does not think that the semantic project can be done prior to the pragmatic project and in fact thinks that it cannot be conceived of as a distinct kind of linguistic analysis (113). All linguistic knowledge is predicated on doing something with language; there is not any speech that does not do something first and there is not any linguistic understanding of a natural language that does not first require that we can do things in the world. Put this way, this point either seems obvious or opaque. But Bauer's goals here are broad and ambitious.

First, Bauer thinks that philosophers of language have misunderstood the explanatory direction of speech acts. The standard assumption is that if speakers are to perform speech acts, they must first understand what the locution performing the speech act means on its own (i.e., what its locutionary content or literal meaning is) (93). But instead, she argues, being able to mean is a function of being able to do. Setting pragmatic analysis apart from any other linguistic analysis is bound to end in failure (88) -- at least insofar as the language under study is a natural one. Bauer suggests that this is at times lost on contemporary philosophers given that many of our puzzles derive from starting out with a formal semantic theory and running into the peculiarities of natural language. Formal semantic theories can operate on their own if applied to ideal, formal languages. The problems of vagueness, for example, are in part the product of our methods and a basic misunderstanding of what a language is as understood by language users (112). This is where I wish Bauer had said much more. Under this reading of Austin, how does Bauer suggest we re-approach linguistic analysis? The semantics/pragmatics divide must surely rest on a confusion, according to what she argues here (and that seems correct), and pushing that dividing line back and forth is similarly confused. Is this a staking of a pragmatics-first approach? One that relegates semantics to the 'parasitic' role? This might be the wrong way to go as well. To be fair, Bauer moves quickly from this argument to the conclusions closer to her concerns (about philosophical authority). But her perspective here is refreshing and singular. Extension of these arguments would have been welcome.

Second, the positive account of what Austin has in mind involves situating his philosophy of language under his ethical theory. As ethical creatures, a good deal of our lives involve us acting and then taking (or failing to take) responsibility for our action (92). As predominately interpersonal, speech is a variety of this and is thus an inherently ethical matter. When we speak we can draw closer to others, baring the mysteries of our private thoughts, revealing, explaining, defending, accounting. In most language use, we are oriented toward some one or many persons -- with ascriptions of respect, familiarity, concern, and so on. Giving or withholding speech, at its most basic, is engagement with others, and engagement with others is structured by ethical norms (97). All speech (not just the blunt and obvious cases of pornographic speech), then, has the potential for ethical valence. Analyzing pragmatic force independently of meaning pretends that taking into account the intentions of a speaker is something that is only relevant some of the time and pretends that this is a semantic rather than an ethical matter (99). Perhaps Austin's book should have been titled The Ethical Implications of Being a Language User. Bauer's surprising suggestion here is that Austin's book is part of an account of ethical behavior much more than it is a study of language even though it has consequences for the latter (103). Using language is ethically bound (Austin's moral theory), and there is much we need to know, morally speaking, in order to use a language (Austin's linguistic theory).

Here's where the central case study of Bauer's book comes to the fore. As mentioned, Bauer does not directly engage with silencing arguments or speech act analyses of pornography. Rather, she asks whether the philosophers who do these kinds of analyses (e.g., Catherine MacKinnon and Rae Langton) themselves understand what they are doing with their own speech (61). While Langton and a number of others parse speech act theory to reveal the harm of pornographic speech, they are failing to put their arguments in terms that give them authority, as philosophers, to provide special insight on these problems.

Bauer makes this point at multiple places, but it never becomes entirely clear what she thinks the alternative would look like. She says that philosophers who write about pornography do so in a way that is "wrong" or "hollow" because they fail to consider, or maybe fail to really see, what pornography is actually like as a phenomenon (105). There is some set of ways in which pornography is used, some ways in which people do things with it, and some ways in which people think about it in their lives and in the lives of others. But philosophers have, at best, a quite distant understanding of it. That is probably correct. A deep sense of the motivational machinery of pornographic culture may not be the expertise of the feminist philosopher (even if she may clearly see its aftermath) (120). Bauer's seeming suggestion is that without a real sense of the phenomenology of pornography in people's lives we are unequipped to analyze it. (But how would we go about doing this? How would we measure success?) This is potentially a game-changing proposal.

It is obvious to Bauer that pornography is integral to many people's sexual lives, teaching them about sexual possibilities, affirming their desires, and introducing them to new ones. When we write about this relationship between the pornographer, the consumer, and the depicted in the distant and plodding manner of analytic philosophy we fail for a number of reasons. The most painful may be that of irrelevance. Bauer's claim here is that much of philosophy simply changes the subject when it brings the world under its analysis. When we write about pornography we risk not writing about any phenomenon that tracks the experience of ordinary people. When we describe sex and gender and language (and surely most everything else too, like happiness and knowledge and religion and poverty) we are describing something other than that which is experienced in the world (146-147). Again, this is not a dull claim on her part that philosophers ought to care more about the perspectives of the folk but rather a more interesting one about philosophical authority. If, for example, a feminist writes about the authority of pornographers in structuring sexual subordination, and she does so with an aim of bringing her expertise to bear on a matter of grave political importance, then her work only matters insofar as she is writing about real pornography and not a stilted, technical version of pornography. As I understand Bauer's argument this is supposed to apply everywhere; analyses of pornography are only an example.

Bauer's greatest insights come in her discussions of objectification, woven throughout the chapters. Unsurprisingly, she worries that feminists tend to distort and thereby misunderstand the phenomena of objectification in general and self-objectification in particular (26-27). (Martha Nussbaum's well-regarded view takes heat here (36).) Bauer is not confident that most standard accounts recognize the role of self-objectification in resisting objectification by others. Bauer reminds us of Beauvoir's work on this subject. While Beauvoir's views lie somewhere outside of our current "theoretical fetishes" on gender, she does offer an analysis that's much more dynamic than current views allow (40). Bauer compellingly describes the line between personhood and self-objectification as "whisper thin" (51). Why is this the case? According to Bauer's reading of Beauvoir, this is because, for all of us, in being subjects of experience, we open ourselves to the objectifying judgment of others (48). This tension -- riding between transcending and cementing our selves -- is with us for all of our experience. So in order for the philosopher to really understand objectification, this phenomenological tension is where she should start. (As an example, this will require a challenging take on apparently demeaning aspects of hookup culture.) It is difficult to disagree with Bauer that this is a far better contender for conceptualizing objectification as a phenomenon. Here again, however, Bauer's work feels as if it has just begun. How, for example, could her Beauvoirian view differentiate between self-objectification as taking possession of the self and that which finally renounces the self? Surely both are possibilities along the course of any given life.

This densely argued, eclectic book offers readers from across the field of philosophy a number of entry points from which to build in productive new directions. I highly recommend it.