How to Know: A Practicalist Conception of Knowledge

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Stephen Hetherington, How to Know: A Practicalist Conception of Knowledge, Wiley-Blackwell, 2011, 260pp., $99.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780470658123.

Reviewed by B.J.C. Madison, University of Warwick


There is very little overall agreement among philosophers concerning the nature of knowledge. Still, certain very general aspects of knowledge are taken to be near platitudes that are rarely challenged, for example, that knowledge entails truth, that it is a kind of mental state, and that it is incompatible with certain kinds of luck. That accounts of knowledge containing these features have so far received little critical scrutiny does not of course mean that they are correct, however. In his latest book, How to Know, Stephen Hetherington forcefully challenges the orthodox conception of knowledge that has come to dominate nearly all contemporary discussions of knowledge. Hetherington's project is not merely critical, however. Instead he proposes a novel alternative theory of knowledge that he calls Practicalism, a theory that says that at root, all propositional knowledge (knowledge that) is ultimately reducible to practical knowledge (knowledge how).

In this review I shall summarize his extended argument before raising some critical questions about three key aspects of the positive account. (1) Has Hetherington established that knowledge-that is always an instance of knowledge-how? (2) Has it been established that knowledge need not entail some form of epistemic justification? (3) Is it possible for there to be knowledge in Gettier situations, as Hetherington claims?

How to Know contains six chapters, three of which are new, and three of which build upon previously published material. The first chapter summarizes what Hetherington takes to be five central features of the standard analytic conception of knowledge. These features are as follows:

  1. propositional knowledge is a mental state, such as a kind of belief, or perhaps a sui generis state, as Timothy Williamson maintains;
  2. propositional knowledge is purely theoretical, in the sense that it is distinct from knowing-how to do something;
  3. propositional knowledge requires good support, such as some form of epistemic justification (of perhaps either internalist or externalist varieties);
  4. propositional knowledge is absolute, in that it does not admit of degrees or grades; knowledge is an all or nothing matter; and finally,
  5. propositional knowledge excludes too much of certain kinds of luck, as brought out by the Gettier debate.

The remaining chapters in the book then argue that these claims are false, or at least that there is room to coherently doubt them. Additionally, Hetherington develops a positive alternative account of knowledge, to be summarized below.

Chapter 2 is in many ways a key chapter in the book, in that it aims to establish, or at least make prima facie plausible, a central tenet of Practicalism: namely, that knowledge-that is knowledge-how. The reader can find the heart of the argument at sec 2.4 which offers the knowledge-as-ability hypothesis, which states: "Your knowing that p is your having the ability to manifest various accurate representations of p. The knowledge as such is the ability as such." (p. 42, original emphasis) Hetherington goes on to illustrate the thesis with an example:

Your knowing that you are in a particular room = Your knowing how to believe accurately that you are in the room, and/or your knowing how to process the relevant data accurately (such as visual data), and/or your knowing how to describe the situation accurately, and/or your knowing how to use relevant concepts accurately, and/or your knowing how to answer questions accurately about the situation, and/or your knowing how to reason accurately about the situation (such as how to link your belief, about being in the particular room, accurately with other beliefs), etc. (Ibid.)

The main argument for this claim comes as a challenge: it is arbitrary, Hetherington argues, to insist that knowledge is a belief or other state, rather than one of the many other cognitive outcomes that accompany propositional knowledge that make up what Hetherington labels one's epistemic diaspora. Hetherington notes that when one knows that p, one also thereby is often able to believe, remember, and assert that p; one is also often able to explain and answer p-related questions when one knows that p, and so on. Many of these members of the epistemic diaspora are abilities. Why can the manifestation of these abilities not be the knowledge, rather than only the belief? These other outputs have just as good a claim to be instances of knowing that p as belief or any other state does, Hetherington claims. Some linguistic evidence for the knowledge-that as knowledge-how hypothesis is also offered (to be briefly discussed below).

It is worth noting a theme here, as Hetherington himself does, that if all knowledge is an ability, Gradualism, the view that knowledge is not absolute, but rather, comes in degrees, will be well supported: abilities come in degrees; if knowledge is an ability, knowledge too will come in degrees. Below I will offer some critical remarks on the considerations offered in favor of the Practicalist thesis.

Chapter 3's central thesis is that the Gettier Problem never was a problem; accordingly, the alleged problem can be dissolved. Hetherington maintains that there can be knowledge in Gettier situations, which is to say that it has not been established that justified true beliefs are insufficient for knowledge. The chapter's main argument is a supposed counter-example to "Gettier's official result". A case is offered in which it is claimed that it is both an instance of knowledge, as well as a Gettier situation; if plausible, the case would establish that at least some knowledge is Gettiered knowledge. The rest of chapter 3 is a thorough discussion of epistemic luck that aims to advance the debate by arguing that so-called veritic luck, a kind of luck that many think is essential to Gettier cases, is actually inessential. Hetherington introduces a notion of "Combinatorial Luck", a more general kind of luck, that he argues better explains how and why Gettier situations arise. Those with an interest in anti-luck epistemology would do well to consult this section of the book.

The thesis of the fourth chapter is in one respect quite modest; in another, if true, it requires most epistemologists to rethink how they conceive of knowledge. The putative platitude about knowledge that Hetherington targets is the claim that knowledge requires good justificatory support, a claim which he labels Justificationism. Hetherington's thesis is not that Justificationism is false; rather, that for all we know knowledge might not require such support. So, if Hetherington's argument is sound, for all we know, true belief might be sufficient for knowledge. Below I will offer reasons to question the scope of Hetherington's argument, suggesting that he seems to be thinking of justification too narrowly.

The central aim of the fifth chapter is to outline a non-reductive analysis of propositional knowledge. The key thesis is that knowledge-that p = knowledge of one or more aspects/constituents of how it is that p. Hetherington terms such knowledge "How-Knowledge"; accordingly, knowledge-that is to be understood in terms of how-knowledge, which is also knowledge-that, but of a specific sort. As Hetherington conceives of it, how-knowledge admits of degrees by being more or less detailed, extensive, exhaustive, etc. So if an equivalence between how-knowledge and knowledge-that can be established, then further to chapter 2, independent evidence for Gradualism about knowledge will be provided (the first argument for Gradualism was that knowledge-that is an ability, and that abilities come in degrees). The chapter concludes with what is perhaps best thought of as the strongest sort of argument for Practicalism: that Practicalism has explanatory advantages that the standard account lacks. Hetherington argues that if Practicalism is true (including therefore its commitment to Gradualism), then epistemological progress can be made in treating various forms of skepticism, as well as the vexed question of the compatibility of privileged self-knowledge and content externalism in the philosophy of mind.

The main aim of the sixth and final chapter is to summarize and relate lines of argument and tie up possible loose ends.

Having now summarized the main lines of argument, I shall offer some critical reservations on three key aspects of the book.

Critical Evaluation

(1) Has Hetherington established that knowledge-that is always an instance of knowledge-how?

A key tenet of Practicalism is the knowledge-as-ability hypothesis. However, very little is said on the relationships between abilities and knowledge-how. Accordingly, sometimes the proposed account seems more plausible when cast in terms of abilities, but other times it does not when cast in terms of knowledge-how. For instance, take Hetherington's illustrative example of knowing that one is in a particular room. On his account, this might amount to knowing how to believe accurately that one is in the room, and/or one knowing how to process the relevant data (e.g., visual data) accurately, and/or one knowing how to describe the situation accurately, etc.

In an extended sense, one has the ability to believe accurately, or to process visual data, in that these are things that one can do. On the other hand, it seems false that virtually anyone thereby knows how to believe something (this is not simply knowing why something is the case) or knows how to process visual data. This seems a matter of sub-personal processing, not a matter of practical knowledge. Since on the face of it, being able to do something is not the same as knowing how to do it -- I am able to digest food; I do not thereby know how to do it -- some substantial account of the relation between them is required.

Another question to raise about the knowledge-as-ability hypothesis is that, even if one grants that knowledge-that entails members of the epistemic diaspora -- that knowledge-that entails having certain abilities -- that is a different claim than that propositional knowledge just is the relevant ability. Recall that the main argument at this stage took the form of a challenge: it is arbitrary to privilege belief over other members of the diaspora; these other phenomena have equal grounds on which to be considered the knowledge that p. Is this correct?

While Hetherington is right to question on what grounds the standard analytic conception of knowledge treats propositional knowledge as a kind of belief, doing so does not seem as arbitrary as Hetherington suggests. When we examine clear cases, there do not seem to be cases of knowing which do not entail belief in the target proposition. On the other hand, knowledge does not seem to entail any other particular members of the epistemic diaspora. For example, one can know that p without remembering it, or asserting it, or acting upon it, etc. So when considering linguistic data in support of Practicalism, Hetherington is right that there is an oddness in saying that "He knows that p, but he doesn't act as if p", or that "He knows that p, but doesn't assert that p". But it is wrong that these assertions are odd for the same reason as if one asserted "He knows that p, but he does not believe that p". The oddity in the case of not acting upon or asserting one's knowledge seems to be unproblematically explained pragmatically. There are clear cases where one can know without asserting or acting upon that knowledge. However, there are no clear cases where one can have knowledge without belief, which supports the hypothesis that the oddness of asserting that someone knows that p, but that they do not believe it, is because the conjunction of such claims is contradictory.

Such considerations seem to suggest that, pace Hetherington, focus on knowledge as a kind of belief is not utterly arbitrary. Establishing that knowledge is a kind of belief is of course a further step, which Hetherington is right to question. But perhaps that can be done by inference to the best explanation: all clear cases of knowledge entail belief; when belief is removed from the case, there is no knowledge; therefore, the best explanation of the covariation of knowledge and belief is that knowledge is a kind of belief (e.g., a true belief, perhaps with further properties).

Granted, there have been putative cases offered of knowledge without belief, e.g., so-called Radford cases (named after Colin Radford who first proposed them). However, these cases are far from clear: some seem to be cases where there is belief, but only to a very weak degree; others, it can be stipulated, contain no relevant belief, but they then seem not to amount to knowledge; in others, the subject may have the relevant belief, but lack the higher-order belief that they have the first belief, etc. My point here is that there are no clear, convincing cases of knowledge without belief, whereas there are clear, obvious, and convincing cases of knowledge without any other members of the epistemic diaspora. This can be used as a justification for thinking that belief is central to knowing in a way that undermines Practicalism.

(2) Has it been established that knowledge need not entail some form of epistemic justification?

A key premise in Hetherington's argument is the claim that to know that Justificationism is true, we would need to know that the world we inhabit is constituted by causal stability, but that we might not be able to know that about our world, either a priori or through experience. The rough idea is that without causal stability, justification would have no value, since what justification is for, what its value consists in, is "tethering" our beliefs to their worldly truth-makers in causally stable and reliable ways. This is an interesting argument that deserves careful attention in itself. However, if sound, the argument falls short of establishing that justification is not required for knowledge. At most it would show that instrumentalist conceptions of justification, those that conceive of justification as necessarily "tethering" beliefs to truths, are not necessary for knowledge.

Hetherington briefly considers non-instrumentalist, or non-tethering notions of justification, typically those that are labeled "internalist" (see sec. 4.5). Specifically, he narrowly considers only aninstance of internalist justification, namely the deontological conception, where epistemic justification is thought of as a matter of not flouting one's epistemic duties and obligations. According to Hetherington, Deontologism holds that whether or not justification obtains depends on how the believer is acting (and so would be conducive to his Practicalism). As presented by Hetherington, it is unclear why he thinks that the deontologist is so committed. Nevertheless, even if this point is granted, and whatever the merits of such a notion of justification might be, there are other internalist concepts of justification that do not, as Hetherington claims, hold that whether or not justification obtains depends on how the believer is acting. These rival internalist notions of justification often involve views about mental states and the relations between them.

For example, some forms of access internalism demand that a subject be aware of some ground that supports her belief (where awareness is a mental state, not an action). Mentalist varieties hold that the justification of belief supervenes on certain features of one's mental states. Still another variety, Phenomenal Conservatism, holds that one has prima facie justification to believe that p if it seems to one that p. My intention here is not to defend these notions of justification; rather, it is to point out that there are internalist, non-instrumentalist conceptions of justification that do not presuppose deontologism, and that these do not seem to involve activity on the agent's part in any way. Until such accounts are shown to be unviable, or that they are really reducible to Practicalism, Hetherington is unable to establish his bold and provocative thesis that knowledge may not require justification.

(3) Is it possible for there to be knowledge in Gettier situations, as Hetherington claims?

In chapter 3 Hetherington provides a rich and detailed discussion of what Gettier situations are, how they arise, and what kind(s) of luck they essentially involve. Still, the primary argument against "Gettier's official result" takes the form of a counterexample where there is meant to be an instance of knowledge, even though the relevant belief is Gettiered. I shall briefly present the example before offering some preliminary critical remarks on whether it is a successful counterexample that establishes what it is meant to.

Hetherington writes,

Suppose that, in a fairly normal way, Noah uses evidence from his senses to believe that he is seeing a tree in front of him. He looks; he believes. And his evidence is sensory in a standard way. There is one additional detail, though. Noah also happens to believe something like this:

NR       If I had to explain how it is true that I am seeing a tree, I would reach for this description: [then follows a brief statement of naïve realism about perception -- in effect, what most philosophers would term a 'folk theory' of perception]. That is all I would need. It is a full explanation. (Hetherington, 2011, p. 80)

Hetherington supposes that NR is false, perhaps in its details, but also certainly in that it is not the whole explanation of how perception is possible -- at minimum some scientific explanation needs to supplement the story. Nevertheless, Hetherington asserts that this case is a Gettier situation, since given Noah's observational evidence and naïve interpretation of that evidence, it is quite an odd orlucky combination of circumstances that have led to his belief that there is a tree in front of him being made true in the way that it is. Still, Hetherington maintains, Noah knows that there is a tree in front of him all the same.

As written, it is somewhat unclear whether Noah knows that he is seeing a tree. On one reading, it seems that he knows that there is a tree in front of him: he has sufficient evidence for that belief, namely his seeming to see the tree, and nothing is untoward about the evidence. On this reading, NR is playing no essential justifying role. On the other hand, if we stipulate that NR is playing an essential justifying role, it is far from clear that this is a case of knowledge. If so, this need not have anything to do with being a potential Gettier situation; rather, perhaps no justification is present since it is undermined, or otherwise defeated, by NR. Perhaps NR is something that Noah ought not believe; or that while it is permissible for Noah to believe it, it is sufficiently misleading so as to defeat what would be his otherwise justified belief.

In short, the case is somewhat under-described as presented. On one reading, it is a case of knowledge, but it lacks an essential feature that might make it a Gettier situation (namely the "oddness" or luckiness brought in by NR). On another reading, the case does not seem to be one of knowledge, since the subject might well lack justification for his belief as it might be defeated by NR. Additionally, if the case did lack a justified belief in the target proposition, then no matter what else was the case, it would no longer be in the running to be a Gettier situation, since by definition a Gettier case entails belief, justification, and truth.

Even if we grant that in the proposed case Noah has knowledge of the presence of the tree, and that he has a justified true belief to that effect, is it a Gettier situation, given the presence of NR? If not, it would fail as a counter-example. A reason to think that the case is not a genuine Gettier situation is that it is not relevantly similar to several paradigm Gettier cases in quite a radical way.

In paradigm Gettier cases, it is notable that there is no connection (for instance, a causal connection) between the subject's justified belief and what makes it true. For example, in Chisholm's well-known sheep-in-the-field case, a subject justifiably believes on the basis of seeming to see a sheep in a field (which is actually a cleverly disguised dog) that there is a sheep in the field. What makes the belief true, however, is a sheep entirely out of view in the same field. To take another example, in Russell's stopped-clock case, the subject justifiably believes it is 10 a.m., for example, by looking at a malfunctioning clock. What makes the belief true, however, is that it just so happens to then be 10 a.m., whereas the clock stopped exactly twelve hours earlier at 10 p.m.

In Hetherington's Noah case, by contrast, the subject's justified belief is connected to its truth-maker in an entirely normal way, that is, Noah sees the tree and believes that he does so on that basis; what is odd is just some false and/or misleading extras, i.e., NR. Accordingly, there is reason to think that even if Noah knows that he is seeing a tree, this does not undermine Gettier's "official result" that justified true belief is not sufficient for knowledge, since the case of Noah is not of the same fundamental kind as the cases that most clearly establish Gettier's result.

Presuppositions and supposed platitudes in philosophy deserve to be challenged. Hetherington's highly original and insightful book does just that. Whether or not one accepts all aspects of Hetherington's alternative positive proposal, epistemologists will have much to gain from engaging with the details of his substantial contribution to the field.[1]

[1] I would like to thank Tony Booth, Rhiannon James, Victoria Madison, Barney Walker, and especially Stephen Hetherington for corresponding with me on some of these issues.