How To Make Opportunity Equal: Race and Contributive Justice

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Gomberg, Paul, How To Make Opportunity Equal: Race and Contributive Justice, Blackwell, 2007, 184pp., $89.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781405160810.

Reviewed by Patrick Goodin, Howard University


The title of Paul Gomberg's book is not An Essay On the Meaning of Equality of Opportunity: Race and Contributive Justice; rather, it is How to Make Opportunity Equal: Race and Contributive Justice. The book presents itself, in other words, as a practical work of philosophy or political philosophy -- a "how to" book, so to speak, addressed to both philosophers and non-philosophers.

The book consists of a very brief preface (at most a page and a quarter) followed by thirteen chapters. There is, properly speaking, neither an introduction nor a conclusion. The argument of the work is stated clearly and succinctly in the preface:

The argument [of the book] is politically and socially radical: I believe that problems of racism and unequal opportunity cannot be solved in capitalist society. The central practical proposal is simple: we need to share labor, including the boring work most of us like to avoid, if everyone is to have an opportunity to develop all of their abilities. The central philosophical innovation is also simple: philosophers have thought that justice is about what people get; I think it is about what people are able to do, particularly how they are able to develop their abilities, give back to society, and be respected for their contributions.

The thirteen chapters that follow flesh out and develop the argument.

As I mentioned in the first paragraph, Paul Gomberg's book should be read as a "how to" book. He begins the first chapter, however, by informing us, "The book you are reading is an essay in utopian political and social philosophy." Now, how does one put together a "how to" book with "utopian political and social philosophy"? In a sense this is the central paradox of the book. On the one hand, Gomberg's work is enormously concrete in its liberal use of and immersion in the socio-political history of the United States.  On the other hand, how it proposes to make opportunity equal -- by making opportunity contributive rather than distributive, that is, allowing all persons the opportunity to earn social esteem by social contribution rather than the distribution of goods -- is highly utopian, to say the least.

In Book One of Plato's Republic, Socrates asks the old man, Cephalus, a series of questions and on the basis of his answers formulates a double-pronged definition of justice as giving back what is owed and speaking the truth. The first prong, when formulated positively, is justice as ownership or the distribution of goods, and the second raises the issue of the political regime within which distribution takes place. Every definition of justice, as far as I know, involves one or both of these prongs. Gomberg's notion of justice is the distributive with a twist: it is made subordinate to the contributive idea. His argument is utterly indifferent to regime. Regime variety is not an issue for Gomberg (or Rawls for that matter) as it is for Plato and Aristotle.

Also, Socrates raises a devastating objection to the definition that turns on the notion of madness. The issue of madness raises an obstacle to the notion of a straightforward, rational pragmatics of justice. Gomberg, again, is oblivious to this issue. For him social and political philosophy is nothing but the rational construction of arguments to show how one brings about a just order and nothing stands in the way but prejudice and ideology, which can be exposed and so cleared away. And this is precisely what he does in the thirteen chapters following the preface.

Chapter one begins with a fuller statement of the problem that concerns Gomberg and how he proposes to solve it. The chapter is divided into seven sections of unequal length. Gomberg begins by restating the problem: The key issue for him is that human beings are imperfect and they must labor in order to survive and flourish. Labor is divided into routine and complex. Most people want complex jobs and try to avoid routine and boring ones. This raises a problem: who gets to do the interesting jobs and who gets forced to do the routine and boring ones? The fundamental issue thus becomes the division of labor, and this will in large part be the core of the "equal opportunity" problem.

According to Gomberg, "Competitive equal opportunity is impossible." The only way to achieve true equal opportunity is to make opportunity non-competitive and to restrict competition to goods that exist in unlimited supplies. He therefore proposes "equal opportunity to attain a constellation of goods: to develop complex abilities, to contribute those complex abilities to society, and to be esteemed for those contributions." The limitlessness of these goods is possible if everyone shares both the routine and complex jobs. The problem could be put in this way: human beings have needs, what they need is in limited supply, and they cannot overcome this. There are two ways to deal with this problem: One way is for persons to compete for these goods, such that those who get the good jobs are able to get a lot of these good things -- the distributive way. The other way is for everyone to get the opportunity to share both the routine and complex labor so no one person or group gets stuck with the bad jobs and everyone contributes and gets esteem for their contribution -- the contributive way. For the remainder of the chapter Gomberg furnishes a brief history of the term "equal opportunity", shows how and why its meaning changes and illustrates the fundamental negativity of unequal opportunity through a relatively detailed discussion of racism in the American context. He uses racism and the harm caused by racial discrimination to illustrate the inherent problem of the division of labor and how to overcome this. According to Gomberg, the way to overcome this is to understand justice contributively rather than distributively; this explains the title of the last section of the chapter, "Race and Opportunity", and the title of the book itself, How to Make Opportunity Equal: Race and Contributive Justice. The remaining twelve chapters of the book merely flesh out in detail the problems with understanding justice distributively and showing how to make opportunity truly equal by understanding it contributively.

In chapter two Gomberg argues against one important way of trying to address the issue of unfair disadvantage: the notion of leveling the playing field. The idea of the level playing field does not and cannot solve the problem equal opportunity. In chapter three he argues against the idea of limiting opportunity. If opportunity is limited it will not be equal.

Chapter four discusses two fundamental and opposed conceptions of egalitarianism, and is one of Gomberg's most theoretical chapters. One of these conceptions is what he calls neoclassical egalitarianism, which turns on the difficulty of labor and therefore emphasizes the compensation due to the laborer at the end of this process. The second conception he calls the "egalitarianism of opportunity." Here the emphasis is put not on the end product but rather on the activity itself, that is, what one contributes as opposed to what one gets. Gomberg of course prefers to think of egalitarianism as "egalitarianism of opportunity", and this is the key to the solution he proposes for the equal opportunity problem. Gomberg ends the book on a highly theoretical note by discussing in great detail why justice is incompatible with a free market economy (chapter twelve) and why it is possible to make opportunity equal only when it is understood contributively (chapter thirteen).

In chapter five Gomberg addresses the question of whether everyone can be esteemed and argues, of course, that everyone can, for if not justice understood contributively cannot be the solution to the equal opportunity problem. In chapter six he defends "the goods for which there can be equal and unlimited opportunity." In chapter seven he sketches "how a society might be organized to realize these goods" and in chapter eight shows how social divisions can be overcome through the communal sharing of complex and routine labor.

In chapters nine and ten Gomberg addresses the two important issues of whether inequality is really necessary (chapter nine) and whether, following Aristotle's view of the master/slave relationship, intelligence distinguishes some human beings from others. As we would expect Gomberg argues against both the necessity of inequality and the master/slave relationship. In chapter eleven Gomberg discusses the centrality of race to the very meaning of political philosophy. Race, he argues, is not an issue peripheral to the essence of political philosophy but in a fundamental sense determines its core. The theme of this chapter was foreshadowed by his discussion of the context of political philosophy in chapter one. Chapters twelve and thirteen, as I mentioned above, complete the book with a detailed discussion of justice understood both distributively and contributively.

It is not possible in a short review to say whether the many arguments of the book -- and there are indeed many -- are persuasive or not. However, the fundamental aporia of the work, as I mentioned earlier, is how to harmonize the "how to" approach, with its emphasis on a detailed sociopolitical contextual analysis, with the utopianism of contributive justice. Put another way, Gomberg asks whether any people or society be persuaded to forgo the tangible fruits of distributive justice for the less tangible social esteem of contributive justice. This will, to say the least, be a hard sell.

Nevertheless, How to Make Opportunity Equal is a bold and principled attempt to grapple with the fundamental problem of justice in the modern world, and along the way manages to throw a great deal of light on the insidious character of modern racial categorizations.