How to Think Seriously About the Planet: The Case for an Environmental Conservatism

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Roger Scruton, How to Think Seriously About the Planet: The Case for an Environmental Conservatism, Oxford University Press, 2012, 464pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199895571.

Reviewed by Joe DesJardins, St. John's University, College of Saint Benedict


There really are two books here, one seemingly written for the culture wars by Roger Scruton, visiting scholar at the American Enterprise Institute, the other insightful and subtle, written by the philosopher Roger Scruton. Beginning with the title and the publisher's blubs on the dust jacket, one anticipates a book that will take aim at environmentalism as a leftist social movement, seeking to set it straight with a dose of some "serious" thinking. In this, especially in the first half of the book, Scruton does not disappoint. Scruton takes contemporary environmentalism to task for an overreliance on big government and big NGOs, for its critique of free markets and consumerism, for its alarmism about global warming.

But there is another book here, one slowly introduced as the chapters unfold and more fully presented in the book's second half. This book transcends the partisan squabbling of left and right, liberals and conservatives, to introduce a philosophically rich account of oikophilia, the love of home, which Scruton believes to be the best hope for the future. This latter book deserves a wider audience than it is likely to get by the inclusion, and I would say unnecessary distraction, of the former.

The logic of the book's structure is straightforward: review alternative views in the opening sections, showing where they are lacking, and present the positive case for the preferable answer in the latter half. By design, then, the opening chapters have a more negative tone than the rest. But Scruton's critiques are often over-generalized, tend towards the ad hominem, and are sometimes downright sloppy. They are also ultimately unnecessary, not only because Scruton's positive case for oikophilia can stand on its own without having to dismiss alternatives, but because many of his own substantive views are not that far out of the mainstream of environmental philosophy.

The thesis of chapters two through four is that contemporary environmentalism is characterized by two fundamental and contradictory tendencies. On the one hand, the environmental movement sees environmental challenges in "hyperbolic" and "alarmist" terms. Every environmental issue is a crisis of global proportions, threatening our very survival. Therefore, environmental issues of this magnitude demand global solutions, big government, big NGOs, more bureaucracy. On the other hand, environmentalists have a deep distrust of economic and political power, especially when it rests with governments, corporations, and market economies. This distrust leads environmentalists to adopt "radical precaution" as their fundamental strategy and, as a result, mainstream environmentalism is incapable of thinking seriously about, or doing much that could actually protect, the planet.

Interestingly, Scruton doesn't disagree that humans face serious environmental threats, they are just not as extreme as the "alarmists" make them out to be. For example, global warming "is a fact," but the resultant global climate change is not "uniquely the result" of anthropogenic greenhouse gases (p. 52). Yet, the threat is dire, and "it is still our problem." Scruton is willing to consider researching geo-engineering responses to global warming, but in the end rejects them as missing the point. Global warming is a human problem, not a technical one and the best long-term strategy, one of adaptation and "resilience," is to change how we live. I daresay that few of the mainstream environmentalists that Scruton dismisses would find any of this unreasonable.

But even the case against the "alarmists" is shoddy. He cites two major sources as examples of the "worst-case scenario": journalist Mark Lynas's book Six Degrees (2007), and climatologist James Hansen's book Storms of My Grandchildren (2009). The sources he then relies on to dismiss Lynas and Hansen include a 1992 paper by Richard Lindzen, a 2000 book, The Satanic Gases, by Patrick Michaels and Robert Balling, and Bjorn Lomborg's 2001 Skeptical Environmentalist. Hardly cutting-edge research in 2012. Insofar as there is an argument here, it is that the "alarmists" have been criticized as guilty of "no better than scaremongering" by skeptics, that they have responded to these skeptics with "rage," "ostracism" and "character assassination." Therefore, the "ordinary reader" is left gasping for cool air and "we cannot predict with certainty what might happen." I suggest that if Scruton truly wished to "think seriously about the planet," he either would have engaged the actual debates between these thinkers, or omitted this section entirely.

The major fault with these early chapters is that he paints with much too broad a brush. Just as there are extremists among those who warn of environmental dangers, there are extremists among those who minimize the challenges we face. The book would have been improved if Scruton had more honestly engaged the rational middle of environmental philosophy and science in his defense of oikophilia.

According to Scruton, the "real question" that we must think seriously about is human motivation. Specifically, how do we motivate people to act in ways that can be effective in addressing global issues, yet avoid the mistake of relinquishing their responsibility and freedom to big government? The answer is oikophilia, the deep-seated human love of place, of home. Oikophilia rests in a middle ground between the individualism of libertarian environmental economics, and the collectivist strategies of left-leaning mainstream environmentalism. His is a European conservatism of tradition and community, more in line with Burke and Oakeshott, than the American version that emphasizes individualism and free markets.

Chapters five and six begin to etch out this middle ground. Scruton's environmental conservatism rejects the overreliance on markets that is characteristic of environmental economics. There is little that is new here, although it is worth having this case made by a self-described conservative. He rejects taking solely a market-based approach to environmental issues not only because of the many well-known cases of market failures, but because "simply put, environmental problems are problems of morality, not economics" (p. 185). As Scruton acknowledges, readers familiar with Mark Sagoff's work will find much of this familiar.

Yet, environmental conservatism is also to be distinguished from what goes on in mainstream environmental philosophy, which Scruton suggests is either utilitarian or what he identifies, always within scare quotes, as a "new ethic." His criticisms of utilitarian ethics are commonplace. Among defenders of the "new ethics," he includes Aldo Leopold, E.O. Wilson, James Lovelock, Holmes Rolston, Arne Naess, Warwick Fox, Christopher Stone, and John Passmore. It is difficult to say what these diverse views have in common other than that they are not utilitarians, but Scruton is content to dismiss the lot with reference to some extreme misanthropic prescriptions (e.g., "we should favour the hungry leopard as much as the child she is stalking"). Never mind that we are never told who among mainstream environmental philosophy holds such a position, it is enough to conclude that no "new ethic" will prove to be a satisfactory philosophy.

Finally in chapter seven, Scruton begins to make the positive case for his conservative alternative. Oikophilia is the love of the household, "which means not only the home, but the people contained in it." It is the place "not just mine and yours, but ours." It includes respect for the dead, tradition, as well as care for future generations. Like Burke, Scruton views society "as an association of the dead, the living, and the unborn." Oikophilia values tradition, "not from nostalgia, but from a desire to love as an enduring consciousness among things that endure." Scruton sees this concern for home as fundamental, as old as humanity itself, and reflected in traditions from the Odyssey to Moses, from Christ to the Baghavad Gita. It "surely identifies a motive that could be called upon in service to the environment." Scruton understands the need to distinguish the love of home from what he sees as the left's love of big and global government, and the right's love of the homeland, which he does more by assertion than argument.

Later chapters sketch normative implications that can be drawn from oikophilia. Stewardship is a primary virtue. The home is a gift from the past and an endowment for the future. Present generations are the trustees of this gift and have a responsibility to respect and sustain it. Oikophilia begins with "our need for nurture and safety, but it spreads out across our surroundings in more mysterious and less self-serving ways." Love and respect of the home, as well as an aesthetic appreciation for its beauty and a "natural piety" for the sanctity of nature, follow as well. Scruton's reflections on aesthetics and beauty are among the very best parts of this book. They are subtle, sophisticated, and moving.

A final chapter, "Modest Proposals," offers some tentative policy recommendations. Something akin to the principle of subsidiarity is first: "prevent the state from undertaking tasks that can be better performed by citizens." The goal of a conservative environmental policy should be "to achieve a managed environment, in which good results arise spontaneously from what ordinary people do." Some very mainstream reflections on sustainability and clean energy follow. Managed pollution growth, aimed at encouraging older people to work longer, limited sprawl, integrating rather than diversifying local communities, and ending subsidies in transportation and agriculture are offered as conservative policies.

Would that Scruton had written a less polemical book. He could have omitted the gratuitous criticisms and instead provided a fuller exposition of oikophilia. Where his policy prescriptions mirror more liberal ones, as his thinking on sustainability, clean energy, and the shortcomings of environmental economics do, he should share the traditional conservative rationale more directly. Both philosophy and public policy would benefit from this.

Importantly, a more scholarly and more practical book would have engaged the conversations of environmental philosophers rather than dismissing them. Despite the book's title, Scruton is not the only person who has thought seriously about these issues. For example, how does oikophilia advance the environmentalist imperative to "think globally, but act locally"? How do his reflections on natural beauty differ from or advance those of John Muir or Aldo Leopold? Is a "natural piety" for nature similar to Albert Schweitzer's Ehrfurcht vor dem Leben, reverence for life? Might the "desire to love as an enduring consciousness among things that endure" be an insightful way to develop Paul Taylor's "concept of a teleological center of life"? How, exactly, does oikophilia differ from Wilson's biophilia?

Scruton's oikophilia, and more importantly his traditional conservative philosophy, has much to offer to environmental thinking. But perhaps the full contribution from conservatism awaits another book, or dissertation.