How to Treat Persons

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Samuel J. Kerstein, How to Treat Persons, Oxford University Press, 2013, 230pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199692033.

Reviewed by Jon Garthoff, University of Tennessee


1. Samuel J. Kerstein's How to Treat Persons picks up where his previous book, Kant's Search for the Supreme Principle of Morality (Cambridge University Press, 2002), left off. The earlier work is an admirably clear and plausible accounting of the argument of Immanuel Kant's Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals. The present volume descends in abstraction, seeking to articulate mid-level principles which best capture the force of Kant's formula of humanity and then to apply these principles to contemporary issues in applied bioethics. The discussion of mid-level principles focuses on what it is to treat another person -- as Kant famously put it -- as a mere means, together with a proposed account of how this idea relates to other ideas central to Kantian ethics, including especially respect for the dignity of persons. The account of treating others as mere means from the first half of the book is applied in the second half to questions in medical ethics, such as the allocation of scarce resources and the proper conduct of research.

In the introduction Kerstein states that he aims to defend the formula of humanity against the charge that it is "hopelessly vague" (2). He aims to accomplish this without thereby defending "an orthodox Kantian account", however, since in his view Kantian orthodoxy is beset with "normative implications that are problematic enough to warrant the development of a new, Kant-inspired account" (2). He also aims to defend the formula of humanity without recourse to a "dignity-deflationist" account where "respect for persons requires that we not interfere with the choices of an autonomous person, unless those choices harm another" (2-3). Such deflationist accounts are prominent in contemporary medical ethics, and Kerstein criticizes them -- in my view rightly -- for implausible implications.

Kerstein's writing, here as elsewhere, exemplifies many virtues of analytic philosophy done well. He formulates principles clearly and motivates these principles with transparency and accessibility. Kerstein interestingly develops the idea that "[a]n agent uses another through using her capacities" (58), and he applies this fruitful idea convincingly to a series of cases. These include several trolley problems (122-124) and the real-world problem of explaining the moral dangers involved in using biological specimens donated for medical research for purposes other than those intended by the donors (198-205).

The book's criticisms of alternative understandings of treating others as mere means also display clarity and patience. Kerstein carefully explicates previous attempted analyses of treating others as mere means according to which such treatment consists in (i) acting such that others cannot share our ends, (ii) acting such that others have no opportunity to consent, (iii) acting such that others would not be rational to consent, or (iv) acting such that others do not in fact consent. In each instance Kerstein succeeds in raising significant doubts about the adequacy of the analysis on offer.

2. Notwithstanding these strengths of the book, I doubt it exemplifies the best strategy for developing and applying a Kant-inspired ethical theory. In an effort to explain why, let me begin with the main dialectical opponent in Kerstein's discussion of treating others as mere means, which Kerstein labels the "respect for humanity" view. This is intended to be the current orthodox Kantian position, and Kerstein credits Allen Wood with its most explicit statement (33-38). Much of the case against this view consists in Kerstein's contention that it delivers implausible verdicts about a range of cases, including when it is permissible to remove life support from a miserably suffering terminally ill person (38-43), when it is permissible to use lethal force in self-defense (43-48), and when it is permissible to sacrifice one's own life to save the lives of others (48-52). While Kerstein is explicit that he does not believe the respect for humanity view must hold that all killing is wrong (36-37), the crux of his criticism of the view is that it purportedly cannot explain why intuitively permissible killings in these sorts of examples express respect for the humanity of the person killed.

This criticism, unlike most in the book, seems problematically uncharitable. Since most orthodox Kantians accept that killing in some such cases is permissible, and hold also that any permissible action can express respect for the dignity of all persons, there is an extremely strong pressure to interpret what is meant by "respect for humanity" so that such killings are compatible with expressing respect for the dignity of the person killed. Kerstein seeks to resist this pressure by shifting the burden: he notes that killing is obviously presumptively disrespectful, canvasses arguments his dialectical opponent might offer to cancel this presumption in the relevant cases, and finds these arguments wanting.

But this argumentative strategy is not, it seems to me, sufficiently evenhanded. Within Kantian ethics, after all, the morality of killing can be approached in a different manner. Unlike deception and coercion, which run afoul of the formula of humanity in the most straightforward way, it is less immediately obvious why destruction of humanity is wrong by the lights of this principle. It is not difficult to argue plausibly that killing is typically wrong under the principle, but an explanation of why is at least somewhat circuitous, since in Kant's view -- as Kerstein no doubt appreciates -- our capacity for rational agency, and not our life or existence as such, is the locus of moral respect.

This is why Kantians typically sympathize with the view Thomas Nagel articulates in "War and Massacre" (Philosophy & Public Affairs 1:2, 1972), his influential discussion of United States military policy during the Vietnam War, that efforts by opposing soldiers on the battlefield to destroy one another often express mutual respect. As Nagel plausibly argues, this helps explain why attempts to kill are less morally problematic than other combat tactics, like spreading disease or depriving enemy combatants of water. Battlefields differ in many respects from the contexts Kerstein discusses, of course, but if attempts to kill can plausibly express respect in a battlefield context it is not clear why the burden of argument lies so strongly with one who claims the same is true in the context of a hospice or a potentially fatal physical assault. Thus even if the respect for humanity approach has not yet provided a complete account of these cases, the burden may still fall on Kerstein to argue more affirmatively that intuitively appealing judgments about these cases cannot be accommodated within that approach.

I suspect Kerstein is skeptical of prospects for developing respect for humanity in this way because he operates with a conception of value descended from G. E. Moore. Kerstein writes that something has unconditional value "if and only if it has a positive value in every context in which it exists" (159-160), for example, an echo of Moore's isolation test for intrinsic value. The phrase also seems a clear deflation of what Kantians normally mean by "unconditional value", which calls into question whether the best Kant-inspired theory would deploy such a conception. The concern here is not that Kerstein is a closet consequentialist, but rather that he articulates and defends Kantian claims using an idiom and method not well suited to that purpose.

Consider Kerstein's discussion of triage. He claims the respect for humanity account of treating persons as mere means cannot accommodate preference for younger persons over older in the allocation of scarce resources without thereby implying the humanity of an older person is of less value than that of a younger. As Kerstein notes this would be an unwelcome implication, for such a blanket prohibition of age discrimination in the distribution of scarce medical resources is questionable. He considers an important reason favoring some forms of age discrimination, namely "that the older person has already had a full human life" (156). He quickly dismisses this as incompatible with the respect for humanity position, however, since "it would suggest that an instance of rational nature that has endured sufficiently long . . . has less worth than an instance that has been around for a shorter time" (156).

The feet of the respect for humanity position cannot, however, be as flat as this. While a Kant-inspired ethical theory may need to dispense with Kant's view that practical agency exists outside time, it can take full cognizance of the fact that practical agency is temporally extended. It is surely relevant to the ethics of killing and letting die that being killed has differential impact on the lives of different people, regardless of how the formula of humanity is best interpreted. What needs respecting under the principle is persons, not persons-at-a-time, so there can be no quick move from differential treatment to unequal status in this case. It is open to a Kantian to hold that the moral problem with killing is not the removal from existence of an inestimably valuable thing, but rather the thwarting and frustrating of agency that characteristically ensues when the material conditions necessary for exercising this agency are removed. This frustration may be more acute for a younger person than an older person, and accordingly equal respect for both is compatible with some preferential treatment for the former when allocating scarce medical resources. Indeed many complications Kerstein introduces later to defend his own account (164-165) also seem available to the respect for humanity account charitably understood.

3. The failure to focus on persons as temporally extended also raises questions when we shift our focus from patients to agents, from the demand-side of ethical theory to its supply-side. If the difficulty with Kerstein's conception of value is that it expresses a Kantian value theory in the idiom of G. E. Moore, the difficulty with his conception of moral norms is that it expresses a Kantian account of these norms in the idiom of W. D. Ross.

Kerstein strikingly announces: "Kant holds that it is always wrong for a person to treat another merely as a means or to fail to honor's someone's dignity . . . the book does not try to defend that view. It holds that it is wrong pro tanto to treat another merely as a means or to fail to honor his dignity, but that, depending on the circumstances, acting in these ways might not be wrong all things considered" (16). This passage sets off alarm bells, and when later it emerges that Kerstein does not rule out interpreting the formula of humanity so that it generates genuine moral dilemmas (47), the Kantian reader is on full alert. These are major departures from Kant's understanding of the Categorical Imperative as a principle of practical rationality and of humanity as a linchpin value singularly capable of supporting the distinctive class of reasons known as moral obligations.

Kerstein, unlike Kant, also endeavors to specify mid-level principles with as little moral content as possible. To the extent feasible he seeks to account for treating someone as a mere means in terms of morally neutral action-descriptions, a strategy for developing ethical theory which seems to me alien to Kantian ethics. Mid-level principles must have moral content, on a Kantian view, or they could not be intelligently applied to cases. The project of developing moral understanding, as a theorist or as an agent, does not consist in reducing moral principles to non-moral vocabulary and then investigating which actions, non-morally described, fall under those principles. That way of developing an ethical theory is more readily married to a thoroughgoing empiricism about moral psychology in the rival tradition of Thomas Hobbes, William Paley, and Jeremy Bentham.

The sheer length of Kerstein's mid-level principles, which sometimes require multiple sentences to state, also fits questionably with Kant-inspired ethics. Such cumbersome principles are not readily assimilated, habituated, or applied in prospective deliberation. Their aim appears to be instead to sort actions right from wrong with as much detail as is feasible. (The book also includes worryingly little discussion of the social context of mid-level principles, though one noteworthy exception is an interesting and insightful commentary at 180-187 on Kant's criticisms of markets in human teeth.)

4. Since the book does not purport to articulate an orthodox Kantian theory, it may seem inappropriate to focus so much attention on its departures from the spirit of Kant's view. The concern is not that Kerstein's view is not true enough to Kant, however, but that the ways it fails to be true to Kant suggest it cannot exemplify the best strategy for developing a Kant-inspired ethical theory. By adopting the idiom and method of intuitionism, Kerstein forfeits the potential of Kantian ethical theory to surpass its deontological rivals in systematicity. Kantian ethics has prospects for unifying our understanding of the entire domain of morality, but it has this potential only in virtue of features Kerstein appears willing to jettison. These features include seeing moral explanation as almost never consisting in logical entailment, seeing moral judgment as almost never consisting in the application of exceptionless mid-level principles, and seeing fundamental principles themselves as exceptionless in a way that precludes genuine moral dilemmas. Efforts to unify the moral domain are discursive; they never reach completion. These features of a Kantian theory enable the work in progress to exhibit greater systematicity, however, and so provide the Kantian approach with potential to yield deeper moral understanding. The alternative route taken by Kerstein leads instead to epicyclical casuistry utterly different from Kant's Doctrine of Virtue, and I doubt such an approach captures the best Kantian ethics has to offer.

Even if these concerns are justified, it should be stressed, the book offers many resources a Kantian ethical theory can incorporate. What Kerstein presents in his mid-level principles as independent sufficient conditions for treating other persons as mere means, for example, may be reunderstood as considerations a conscientious agent must take cognizance of -- as rules of moral salience, in Barbara Herman's phrase from The Practice of Moral Judgment (Harvard University Press, 1993, 78-93). How to Treat Persons exhibits greater insight into Kantian ethics, and offers more resources for the future development of that tradition, than another book with which it often engages, Derek Parfit's On What Matters (Oxford University Press, 2011). Nevertheless the present work seems to me less successful than Kerstein's previous effort, for it suffers to a much greater extent from what Herman aptly called, in her commentary on Parfit's second opus, a mismatch of methods.