How We Act: Causes, Reasons and Intentions

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Berent Enç, How We Act: Causes, Reasons and Intentions, Oxford University Press, 2003, 272pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199256020.

Reviewed by John Bishop, University of Auckland


Is it possible to understand agency as realised within a world construed ’naturalistically’ in terms of causal relations amongst events and states of affairs, or does an ontology adequate for agency require ’sui generis acts’ that are essentially voluntary, such as volitions or ’agent-causation’? Berent Enç’s impressively thorough and carefully argued book defends the possibility of naturalising agency via a causal theory of action (CTA). There are three highlights: first, his – I would say, definitive – treatment of the key notion of basic action in developing a CTA (Chapters 2 and 3); second, a ’general and original’ solution to the problem of causal deviance (Chapter 4); and, third, an attempt to answer the objection that CTA ’removes the agent from the picture altogether’ by offering ’a purely causal model for the deliberative process that underlies practical reasoning’ (Chapter 5). As well, Enç has chapters on the problems with volitional theories (Chapter 1); on intentions and intentional action (Chapter 6); and on the compatibility of his CTA with attractive accounts of autonomy and freedom (Chapter 7).

To provide a causal definition of action, Enç argues, it is necessary to make precise a notion of ’basic behaviour’, to explain what it is for basic behaviour to count as basic action, and to explain how non-basic actions can be ’generated’ from basic ones. The leading idea here is that it is ’the pattern of practical reasoning’ that is ’the real source of the need to introduce basic acts’ (p.52). Practical reasoning must end in an act the agent knows how to do – in the sense that she knows how to bring about the type of event which is the ’*result*’ of that act without, in order to do so, having to use her knowledge of how to bring about any different type of event. (Enç uses the technical notion of an action’s *result* as the event-type necessary but not sufficient for that kind of action to occur, and whose description ’carries all the information contained in’ an attribution of the action except for its having status as such (see p.9).) Basic behaviour, then, is behaviour in which the agent exercises immediate ’know how’ in bringing about a particular type of event – and an agent’s repertoire of basic behaviour may, and typically does, change over time (consider shoe-lace tying, for example). For token basic behaviour to count as action it must be caused (in the ’right’ kind of way) by the agent’s intention to bring about an event of the relevant ’basic *result* type’. Non-basic actions are then ’generated’ from basic actions, through appropriate relations obtaining between their respective *results* – relations which include, but are not confined to, causal relations. (Thus, my voting for the motion is generated by my raising my arm at the right time in virtue of certain conventions; my interrupting my neighbour’s view of the chairman is generated by my raising my arm just because – given the physical situation – my arm’s coming to be in that position constitutes an interruption to her line of sight; and my annoying my elderly relative is generated, at a further remove, by my raising my arm because – qua voting for a motion of which my relative disapproves – it causes his chagrin.)

A structure of this general kind is, of course, familiar from previous causal theorists of action, but Enç’s treatment is, I think, particularly sure-footed in its avoidance of previous problematic definitions of the notion of a basic action, and its deployment of some fresh insights. Notable, here, is Enç’s identification of a further kind of generative relation, and his related use of current theories of animal behaviour to put paid to the tendency to ’internalise’ basic actions. That tendency arises from recognising that the bodily movements that are typically the *results* of what we may initially take to be ’basic’ actions are caused by antecedent physiological events (efferent nerve signals, muscular contractions, etc.) which themselves seem to be things that the agent ’does’. Enç skillfully saves that intuition, without yielding to the tempting but absurd conclusion that all an agent ever really basically does is to send nerve signals, by (i) appealing to an account of animal behaviour in which an animal’s ’command centre’ triggers a ’package behaviour, the way one orders a packed lunch from a hotel …, being confident that what goes into the package will be selected by competent personnel’ (p.65), and (ii) maintaining that a basic action thus generates non-basic actions whose *results* are the physiological events causally antecedent to the *result* of the basic action. (See p.92, where Enç defines the ’generation’ relation: some further restriction will be needed, I think, to specify how far back in the causal chain a relation generating non-basic action can extend. It is clear enough what Enç’s answer must be: only as far as the contours of the relevant ’package behaviour’.)

The dialectical core of Enç’s book is his attempt to answer what he takes to be two important objections to a CTA. The first – which he describes as a ’somewhat technical problem’ (p.3) – is that CTA will be unsuccessful because it cannot specify in purely event-causal terms what it is for a causal pathway from mental events to behavioural ’output’ to be ’non-deviant’. (A classic case of deviance is Davidson’s example of the climber who wants to be rid of the weight and danger of holding his colleague on the end of a rope and believes he has only to let go to satisfy this desire – and is then made so nervous by these thoughts that he lets go.) The second objection, which Enç considers ’much more influential’ (p.3), is that CTA cannot capture what it is for an agent to be active: ’reasons cause an intention, and an intention causes bodily movements, but [in this picture] nobody – that is no person – does anything’ (J.D.Velleman, ’What Happens When Someone Acts?’, Mind, 101, 1992, p. 461, quoted by Enç, p. 134). Enç deals with these objections in turn, providing a solution in Chapter 4 that he claims shows ’that deviance is really not a serious problem’ (p.133), and then going on in Chapter 5 to deal with the ’harder problem’, which is ’to persuade the sceptics that a coherent concept of agency or of control can be located in mere event causation’ (p.133).

According to CTA, we have agency when behaviour results from the agent’s reasons for so behaving. Causal theorists therefore owe an account of what it is for a behaver’s motivational states to count as reasons, and to cause behaviour qua reasons. What is the distinction between (for example) the diving behaviour of the moth, triggered when it hears a sound of high frequency of the kind produced by the sonar mechanism of its bat predators, and behaviour that is done for reasons? Enç’s answer is that acting for reasons requires deliberation – the weighing of prospective alternative actions, and choosing amongst them. Mental causes that constitute the agent’s reasons consist in a desire for some end, Q, the recognition of circumstances C, and an instrumental belief of the form ’if under C, action A is done, Q results’. A causal pathway from these states to the action A cannot, as Enç observes, be represented as an ’&-gate’ as is possible with the moth’s ’tropistic’ response where the detection of the high-pitched sound suffices to trigger the ’mere’ disposition: ’if high-pitched sound detected, dive’ (see p.151). But, precisely because rational mental causes do not operate so automatically it may appear that their efficacy requires irreducible mental acts of weighing, evaluating, ordering and deciding. Enç quotes Gary Watson: ’The distinctive libertarian thought is that I must have the power to determine which, among the alternatives I have the capacity to entertain, I shall will (undertake, try for …).’ (’Free Action and Free Will,’ Mind 96, 1987, p.169). Enç claims to be able to show that ’ “the distinct[ive] libertarian thought” can be easily captured by a causal theory of action without resorting to concepts of willing, undertaking, or a special sense of trying …’ (p.153).

Enç’s positive case here ultimately amounts, I think, to the claim that a sufficiently complex causal mechanism can be what realises an agent’s power of deliberation. He supports this claim by arguing that, for genuine deliberation, the semantic contents of the conditionals of instrumental beliefs about at least two alternative behaviours need to contribute to the generation of the agent’s preference ordering which leads to the decision: ’the only way this can happen is for the computational system to run a series of “what if” scenarios’ (p.157). These ’scenarios’ indicate likely consequences of the various available actions, and these need to be evaluated ’with reference to the higher order priorities of the agent’, which therefore need to be ’articulately represented’ (p.161).

There seem good prospects, then, for a causal model of rational decision making that distinguishes it from tropistic, pure stimulus-response, behaviour – though Enç’s model seems to rule out the possibility of an agent’s acting on any ’built-in strong preference’ (see p. 157), which is perhaps an unwelcome consequence. But, even if Enç has not quite carved at the joints, his model does point in the right direction. Yet such models will avail little unless it is possible to rebut sceptical arguments to the effect that no purely event-causal mechanism can ever amount to an agent’s doing anything. What does Enç have to say about such arguments?

Enç rightly sets aside arguments that claim that agency cannot be realised in a deterministic event-causal mechanism, by drawing attention to the fact that his causal model is neutral as to whether the causal relations concerned are deterministic or indeterministic (see p. 162). The real source of scepticism, he emphasises, is the claim that exercises of agent-control are irreducible to event-causal relations tout court. What positive view of agency is required, though, if one endorses this irreducibility claim? Enç notes that ’even many libertarians’ find accounts of agency that involve agent-causal interventions into event-causal processes ’too mysterious to do any theoretical work’ (p.164). Yet his own very sensible verdict on the attempts of recent anti-agent-causationist libertarians (e.g., Clarke, Kane, Ekstrom) – namely that ’without introducing irreducible agency causal indeterminancy seems to be the wrong source with which to explain how one could have done otherwise’ (p.167) – reinforces the view that the only serious alternative to CTA is indeed the ’mysterious’ agent-causationist position. Unless one is satisfied that the mysteriousness of a position is enough to exclude it, one will find, I think, that Enç’s discussion in Chapter 5 runs rather into the sands so far as defending CTA against scepticism about natural agency is concerned.

Since, as Enç acknowledges (see p. 95), agent-causationism draws comfort from the fact that a CTA faces the problem of causal deviance, a good way to counter it is to show that this problem has a clear event-causal solution – and that is what Enç undertakes in Chapter 4. Providing an event-causal specification of what it is for agents’ reasons to cause their behaviour in the ’non-deviant’ way is thus more than a technical problem: it is crucial to the attempt to blunt the force of agent-causationist intuitions (to which, truth be told, everyone is at times prone). His proposed solution to the deviance problem in Chapter 4 accordingly takes on a rather larger importance than Enç himself advertises for it.

He favours a teleological solution to the deviance problem, which is common to all causal theories (of perception, knowledge and representation, as well as of action.) In Enç’s view, an agent’s intention causes matching behaviour non-deviantly just in case the causal mechanism yielding the behaviour is working ’in the way it is supposed to’ (p.131) – where this is to be understood in the case of natural agents as a matter of fulfilling the function for which it was naturally selected (see pp 108ff). He criticises structural accounts of non-deviance – for example, in terms of a ’differential explanation’ condition (Peacocke) or a requirement of a pattern of ’stepwise’ counterfactual dependence of behaviour on intention (Lewis).

Enç supports this criticism with an intriguing argument to the effect that the very same causal structure can be construed either as deviant or as non-deviant, relative to how its ’well-functioning’ is viewed: ’the way a system is supposed to do something is not capturable by stipulating certain structural requirements on the causal path’ (p.106). Enç illustrates this claim with the recondite case of the actor whose role requires him to appear nervous, and whose intention to become nervous – you guessed it! – causes him to be nervous, so that he behaves apparently nervously just as intended. Enç observes that the first time this happens the actor’s behaving nervously is not an intentional action (it is caused by his intention to appear nervous, but deviantly so). Yet on subsequent occasions the actor may ’exploit the deviance’, and form the intention to appear nervous with the intention that this will trigger nervousness sufficient to ensure that his behaviour appears authentically nervous. There is then no deviance affecting his (non-basic) action of making himself appear nervous. Here we seem to have a case where the very same causal structure can be either deviant or non-deviant. Whether this is enough to rule out structural approaches to specifying non-deviance is doubtful, however: one might observe, for one thing, that, when the deviance is exploited, it remains the case that no basic intentional action of appearing nervous occurs.

Furthermore, Enç glosses his teleological condition on non-deviance as imposing an ’explanatory relation requirement’: C causes S ’in the way it is supposed to just in case: for any intermediate link, X, in the chain from C to S, the fact that C causes X is explained by the fact that X results in S’ (p.111). But it is hard to see why this doesn’t count as a – competing – structural theory of non-deviant causal pathways. Indeed, it was so conceived by a previous advocate of a teleological approach to the deviance problem – namely Martin Davies (’Function in Perception’, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 61, 1983, 409-426). (Note several erroneous references in text and footnotes to ’Davies (196 3)’. Otherwise, the book contains admirably few errors.) In any case, if an account of non-deviance is to dispel the intuition that agent-control is irreducible, we surely need to show how event-causal pathways of certain kinds can realise agent-control, and it is hard to see how anything other than some sort of structural account could achieve that goal. In the final section of Chapter 4, Enç provides a subtle discussion of heteromesial cases where a second agent’s action is required to complete the chain from the first agent’s intention to his behaviour, sufficient to show, I think, that intuitions about these kinds of cases alone could not reasonably lead one to hold out against a CTA (see pp 128ff).