How We Fight: Ethics in War

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Helen Frowe and Gerald Lang (eds.), How We Fight: Ethics in War, Oxford University Press, 2014, 196pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199673438.

Reviewed by Mark Jensen, United States Air Force Academy


Classical Just War Theory is in crisis. The breakdown of the Westphalian international order, the muddling of the distinction between combatants and non-combatants, and the rise of ethnic, tribal, and religious conflict together undermine the central presuppositions of the tradition. However, international recognition of the principles of classical just war theory is a strong as ever. For example, many nations use force only in defense, and nearly all justify their use of force only in these terms. New weapons and tactics have been developed to minimize threats to non-combatants. Moreover, the approach of Western nations to ending conflict is to secure a path toward popular sovereignty, representative governance, and protection of individual rights. To be sure: recent events demonstrate just how far we are from consensus on the norms governing just war as well as from a widespread commitment to act in accord with these norms. But among Western nations and many others, we see a renewed emphasis on ethical warfighting.

These worries about the coherence and relevance of classical just war theory, together with policymakers' and defense institutions' growing interest in formulating ethical strategies and tactics for military action, have catalyzed scholarship on the ethics of war over the past ten to fifteen years. In other words, there has never been a better time to be work on these issues -- both in terms of philosophical sophistication and in terms of practical significance. This collection of papers edited by Helen Frowe and Gerald Lang is a masterful example of the former. At the same time, these papers (originally presented at a conference in 2010) are recent enough to capture mature reflection on issues drawn from wars in Iraq and Afghanistan.

This is not to say that the papers are devoted to exploring recent history. In fact, only F. M. Kamm's chapter on resistance and suicide engages in any depth with actual conditions and events. Instead, the backdrop of these recent conflicts establishes the importance of the issues under investigation. The fact that the war in Iraq was a preventive war justified largely on the basis of bad intelligence motivates questions about the ethical justification for preventive war as well as questions about the ethical justification for pacifism. The deaths of so many non-combatants in these wars, together with clear efforts on the part of Western coalition forces to avoid them, motivates questions about the ethics of self-defense and the coherence of the doctrine of double effect (DDE).

There is not space here to consider each of the ten papers in detail, but it might be helpful for those considering this book to have a brief statement of the central line of argument in them. For simplicity, I provide a numbered list:

1)    In "Varieties of Contingent Pacifism in War," Saba Bazargan defends the plausibility of several forms of contingent pacifism -- the view that while war might be permissible in theory, very few (if any) actual wars meet the required justificatory conditions in practice. The most plausible forms of contingent pacifism, he contends, are those grounded on the unreliability of government judgments regarding the justness of a given war.

2)    In "Punitive War," Victor Tadros argues that, in addition to wars of defense, it may be possible to provide moral justification for wars aimed at deterrence, where such wars are punitive in the sense that they punish a country for previous aggressions or for activities that foretell future aggression. To be clear, part of the justification here is forward-looking: beyond retribution, a justified punitive war aims to change the behavior of the target nation. Nevertheless, the difficulties involved in focusing harm on the guilty rather than the innocent in the target nation will make such a war hard to justify.

3)    In "Why Not Forfeiture?", Gerald Lang argues that the best way to understand my right to self-defense in the face of an aggressor is to see the aggressor as having forfeited his right not to be harmed. Forfeiture is not by itself sufficient to explain self-defense; it must be partnered with a license for me to use violence in response to an attack.

4)    In "Self-Defense, Just War, and a Reasonable Prospect of Success," Suzanne Uniacke defends the "reasonable prospect of success" condition in just war theory but distinguishes its relevance in cases of war from its relevance in cases of personal self-defense. On her view, this condition is important for jus ad bellum judgments about the justness of a given war -- one should not go to war without a reasonable prospective of success. However, in the context of personal self-defense, this condition does not hold: one need not see any hope for success in order to justify resisting an assailant.

5)    In "Self-Defense, Resistance, and Suicide," F.M. Kamm argues that women living in the Taliban regime had rights of self-defense, resistance, and even suicide in the face of the particular set of oppressive conditions that they faced prior to 2001. The cultural and political system of the Taliban confined women to their homes with possible punishments of physical attack, rape, or death if they should leave. On Kamm's view, these conditions open up a broad right to violent resistance, both on the part of the women themselves and on the part of others who might intervene on their behalf.

6)    In "Are Justified Aggressors a Threat to the Rights Theory of Self-Defense?", Adam Hosein defends a rights theory of self-defense against the objections of Jeff McMahan. Of special interest here is the "tactical bomber" case, in which a bomber aircraft involved in a just war intends to destroy a munitions factory adjacent to the border, recognizing that some collateral damage is likely in the small village just across the border. The question that generates the problem here is this: may citizens in the village use anti-aircraft weapons to defend themselves against the justified aggression of the bomber? On Hosein's view, it is permissible for the villagers to defend themselves on rights theory, not because the bomber is doing something wrong, but because the bomber will wrong the villagers. It is in virtue of being wronged that the villagers are justified in self-defense.

7)    In "Self-Defense Against Justified Threateners," Jeff McMahan considers the same case. The philosophical question here is similar to the question considered by Hosein: in cases of justified aggression, to what extent is it permissible for bystanders to act in self-defense? In contrast with Hosein, McMahan sees little room for self-defense on the part of the villagers. While they are not required to "allow themselves to be sacrificed for the sake of the greater number," (131) they may take actions to prevent their own deaths only provided that they do not "kill people who are not liable to be killed," (131) namely, the bomber crew.

8)    In "Just War Theory, Intentions, and the Deliberative Perspective Objection," Kasper Lippert-Rasmussen defends a more traditional reading of intention in the doctrine of double effect against objections and alternatives proposed by T. M. Scanlon and Judith Thomson. While there is certainly an oddity in the DDE in the way that the moral permissibility of an action changes depending on the intentions of the agent, this oddity can be accounted for. At the same time, Scanlon and Thomson's attempts to preserve the distinctions drawn under the DDE without a reliance on the idea of intension fail.

9)    In "Risking and Protecting Lives: Soldiers and Opposing Civilians," Noam Zohar takes on a set of issues similar to those considered in the immediately preceding chapters. He argues for a more restricted reading of the DDE -- a reading that gives additional weight to the lives of non-combatants who are put at risk in an otherwise permissible military operation. Zohar is especially concerned with a practice he calls "Soldier's Safety First," in which the risks to soldiers are minimized at the expense of the risks to non-combatants. Zohar argues that soldiers and military organizations should accept greater risks to their own safety in order to refrain from knowingly killing civilians.

10) Finally, in "Non-Combatant Liability in War," Helen Frowe argues that non-combatant supporters of an unjust aggressor are liable to defensive violence on the part of the just side of the conflict. To be clear: she is not arguing that non-combatant supporters should be killed by just combatants -- in most cases, there is no military advantage to targeting them. Rather, Frowe argues that non-combatants on the unjust side are not protected by the classical just war doctrine of non-combatant immunity; instead, any protection they have is grounded on considerations of tactical proportionality. As a result, when killing non-combatant supporters of an unjust regime results in a military advantage to the just side of the conflict, such attacks are permissible.

The approach of each of these essays is analytic. Authors' arguments are narrow, grounded in an ongoing discussion of an issue alive in the literature, and developed through a consideration of hypothetical examples and counterexamples. As a result, this book should not be seen as an introduction to just war theory or even as a way to get current on contemporary scholarship. (On the latter point, notably missing are any essays on questions involving jus post bellum -- one of the aspects of just war theory that has received serious attention in light of recent wars.) I should also note that every contribution is working within and is largely sympathetic to the classical just war tradition. To be sure: these authors aren't reactionary -- Frowe's essay, for example, challenges the classical understanding of non-combatant immunity. But it would be fair, I think, to regard these essays as conservative: each presupposes the ethical legitimacy of war and begins its analysis inside the context of that tradition. Finally, the analytic and technical nature of this book will limit its appeal. It will be most useful to scholars of ethics in war -- each of its contributions provides a significant advance to a discussion with respect to a narrow issue. It will be useful as well to advanced students of ethics in war -- upper level undergraduate courses and graduate level courses. As I noted above, it will not be useful as an introductory text and, unfortunately, it will not be useful to policymakers and defense institutions looking to bridge the gap between theory and practice. This latter point is not necessarily a problem -- it is not the book's purpose to be practical. But it would certainly be advisable for the contributors to take opportunities in the future to spell out the implications of their arguments for those who aim to lead and fight in a just war.