How We Get Along

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J. David Velleman, How We Get Along, Cambridge UP, 2009, 219pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521043403.

Reviewed by Allan Hazlett, Fordham University



This is a revised and expanded version of the 2007 Shearman Lectures, presented at University College, London, in which Velleman offers an informal survey of his views in ethics and moral psychology, one that aims to unify those views via an analogy between acting for reasons, in general, and improvisational acting, in the theatrical sense. Though the presentation is novel, most of the material is not new: Velleman describes and defends positions previously described and defended in The Possibility of Practical Reason (Oxford UP, 2000) and Self to Self (Cambridge UP, 2006). Those looking for an introduction to Velleman’s thought will find it here; the details are in the essays to which he makes frequent reference in the footnotes. Given this, however, the book provides a useful map of Velleman’s work, and a framework within which to see it as unified.

Velleman’s position, as he perspicuously describes it, is a “middle ground between Williams and Kant” (p. 148). Crudely put, on the one side we have Kant saying that the nature of practical reason necessarily makes immorality irrational, while on the other side we have Bernard Williams saying that the nature of practical reason makes morality optional. On Velleman’s view, the constitutive aim of action is folk-psychological intelligibility, which (given an argument, more on which below) puts rational pressure on practical reasoners to be moral. Thus the rationality of morality is not contingent on one’s having sympathetic concern for others (as for Williams), nor does rationality “guarantee” morality (as for Kant).

The leading idea of Velleman’s book (though one that is not essential, as far as I can tell, to the defense of his position) is that there is an illuminating analogy between acting for reasons, in general, and improvisational theatrical acting. The idea that human beings are “joint improvisers” seeking “self-enactment” runs throughout the book, and Velleman appeals to it to explain most of his central themes. It seems to me that this analogy rings false throughout, but, in any event, here is the idea. An improvisational actor has in mind a certain character, whom she aims to enact. Enacting said character amounts to acting in ways that make sense or are intelligible given “the character’s wants, values, convictions, habits, emotions, and traits of personality” (p. 13). Velleman then asks us to imagine an actor who enacts herself: she will try to do what is intelligible given her wants, convictions, and so on. She will thus aim to act in ways that make sense, to her, given her conception of herself, i.e. for “self-understanding” (p. 26 and passim). This, on Velleman’s view, is the essence of all action done for reasons, so that “the process of improvisational self-enactment constitutes practical reasoning” (p. 18).

This picture — of action as a kind of self-enacting performance — is plausible when applied to certain cases:

Imagine that the improviser is terribly sad and disposed to cry. Maybe he starts to cry involuntarily, in an uncontrolled outpouring of emotion. If he knows what he is crying about, then the crying may strike him as the very thing that his character would do under the circumstances, and so it will strike him as the very thing to enact, drawing on the tears supplied by the emotion. He will therefore cry out of genuine sadness but also under the guidance of his own conception of crying as what it would make sense for his character to do. (p. 15)

But Velleman wishes to understand all action done for reasons (as opposed to involuntary behavior) on the model of improvisational theatrical acting, and there seem to be actions, even entire species of actions, for which this model seems implausible. I have just unwrapped a bagel, dressed with cream cheese and bacon; I’m hungry, and so I pick it up and take a bite. My eating the bagel, to be sure, makes folk psychological sense. But in eating it I am not trying to do something that makes folk psychological sense! I simply want to eat the bagel, I know how to eat it, and straightaway I eat it. Some actions, to be sure, are in an important sense performances (whether for ourselves, as they often will be on Velleman’s view, or for others); crying is plausibly one of these. But other actions, like eating a bagel, may have no such performative element; to say that one of my motives in eating this bagel is to do something intelligible is to posit “one thought too many”.

This worry may be beside the point, as the crux of Velleman’s view is that intelligibility is a constitutive standard of correctness for actions (pp. 133-5). My practical reasoning, as such, will be successful or unsuccessful to the extent that it issues in intelligible action, regardless of whether I actually care about the intelligibility of my actions (although Velleman maintains that such concern is “naturally inescapable”, p. 136-7).1 The normative “pressures” of practical rationality are built into the nature of action, as such.

This raises an important question about the metaethical status of Velleman’s view. He expresses sympathy for Williams’ idea that morality can’t be “part of the fabric of the world”, and elsewhere describes his ethics as a kind of “naturalism” (p. 115; Self to Self, p. 15). His aim is “to account for what is less clear, normativity, in terms of what is more clear, psychological explanation” (p. 27). But this is not the naturalistic metaethics of Hume: intelligibility is the norm of action not because we care about intelligibility, but because “this aim is inherent in the nature of action” (p. 127n, see also p. 87). For Hume and Williams, normativity is always contingent on the motivational set of some person; for Kant and Velleman, normativity is a necessary feature of practical reason, as such. On this view, the normativity of “making sense” is “woven into the fabric of agency” (p. 147).

There is a certain kind of naturalist who should balk at this. Why is normativity “woven into the fabric of the agency” any better than normativity “woven into the fabric of the world”? To say that some norm is constitutive of action doesn’t explain what is less clear (normativity) in terms of what is more clear (psychology); at best it makes us realize that what we thought was more clear really wasn’t. If normativity is naturalistically puzzling, finding out that psychology is normative adds to, rather than subtracts from, our puzzlement.2

Setting that aside, how does the normativity of practical reason ground morality? Here Velleman argues that intelligibility is more simply (and therefore more reliably) obtained through honest collaborative improvisation — the person who aims to act intelligibly should aim not only for self-understanding, but also to be understood by others (p. 64-66). We engage in mutually understood and repeatable “scenarios”, which further our goal of enacting ourselves intelligibly (pp. 71-74). In sum, “rational agency favors participating in a shared way of life, in order to have access to the resources for self-understanding that it affords” (p. 77). This means that there are “rational pressures” that “favor ways of life structured by universality, transparency, and mutuality” (p. 161).

In developing this account of morality, Velleman appeals to a notion of authenticity. Successful collaborate improvisation happens when all parties are authentic in their performances, and what authenticity amounts to, for Velleman, is a species of self-knowledge. The authentic person “knowingly portray[s] himself”, while the inauthentic person acts “on a false conception of what he is doing” (p. 90, p. 26). Because action’s constitutive aim is intelligibility, in acting for reasons we aim at self-understanding; in as much as inauthentic failures of self-knowledge will necessarily interfere with the goal of self-understanding, a further constitutive aim of action is authenticity.

In The Ethics of Authenticity (Harvard, 1991) Charles Taylor describes a 20th century “culture of authenticity”, which shares with Velleman’s view the idea that our principal ethical imperative is to be true to ourselves (or, as Velleman would put it, to give authentic improvisational self-enactments).3 There Taylor associates the culture of authenticity with a kind of social progressivism. In an interesting twist, Velleman’s ethics of authenticity has conservative implications: practical reason never asks us to change in ways that would not make sense given our present self-conceptions; such a request would be an imperative to inauthenticity. For example, if we cannot make “good, honest sense of ourselves” without traditional gender roles, then we should not give them up (pp. 82-4). The same would seem to apply, for example, to a die-hard racist who can find no intelligible way to drink from the same fountain as those of the race she despises.4 This may or may not be a liability for the view.

There is a sense of ‘inauthenticity’ on which acting, in the theatrical sense, is a paradigm of inauthenticity. For Velleman, the difference between a person acting for reasons, in general, and a theatrical actor is that the latter is pretending to be someone else. Acting for reasons, in general, is like theatrical acting but without the pretense. (For my part I found this difference large enough to render the analogy with theatrical acting unhelpful.)

However, there is something more involved in the everyday idea that theatrical acting is a paradigm of inauthenticity. It’s the fact that acting seems to involve the aforementioned “one thought too many”: inauthentic people, we want to say, don’t simply do what they want to do, but in addition they always think about what someone like them is supposed or expected to do under the circumstances that they are in. The decisions of the inauthentic person are always mediated by their self-conceptions; the decisions of the authentic person are not. In this sense of ‘inauthenticity’, Velleman’s paradigm of acting for reasons is also a paradigm of inauthenticity. I don’t mean to suggest that Velleman is wrong that much of our behavior, and in particular our social behavior, should be understood as a kind of performance. But if that is so, then I think we have discovered that one kind of inauthenticity, far from being a failure of rationality, is exemplary of rational action.

From what has been said, I hope it is clear that this is a rich and fascinating book, one that addresses a multitude of important and interesting issues, and one that will provide fertile ground for future discussions of the nature of rational action and the sources of normativity. For those not familiar with Velleman’s work (or even for those not familiar with the issues he’s addressing), this book provides a worthy introduction; for those who already know his impressive body of work, it provides an illuminating synthesis of those ideas.

1 Cf. Velleman’s defense of the ubiquity of the “self-consistency motive” in “From Self Psychology to Moral Philosophy”, reprinted in Self to Self, pp. 224-52.

2 Analogous to the problem of the amoralist is the problem of the ‘arationalist’ who is apathetic about making sense: the Walt Whitman who is vast, and contains multitudes. However, Velleman rightly argues that inconsistency and ambivalence are not always a vice (p. 48).

3 Velleman wisely concedes that there are exceptions to the rule of authenticity: experimentation with new ways of life may involve an unobjectionable “initial period of inauthentic pretense” (p. 160).

4 Cf. Velleman’s praise for acting in accordance with “recognizable regularities” (pp. 45-6). Authentic action for reasons will, for Velleman, tend to conserve existing self-conceptions, and spontaneous, inexplicable action will tend to be bad, qua action. This doesn’t mean that people can’t or don’t change, just that there is rational pressure against it, built into the nature of practical reason.