How We Hope: A Moral Psychology

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Adrienne M. Martin, How We Hope: A Moral Psychology, Princeton University Press, 2014, 149pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691151526.

Reviewed by Erica Lucast Stonestreet, College of St. Benedict/St. John’s University


Adrienne Martin’s book is a detailed analysis of an ordinary phenomenon that has not had much attention in recent moral psychology. The account extends the “orthodox” view of hope (as a desire for an outcome together with a belief in the outcome’s possibility) by adding what Martin calls an “incorporation” element: what distinguishes hope from other attitudes is the hopeful person’s incorporating the desire into her agency as a reason for hopeful activities. Her treatment seriously engages many historical and contemporary views of hope, ultimately aligning most closely with Kantian ideas of moral psychology.

Her motivating challenge to the orthodox definition of hope involves two cancer patients, Alan and Bess, who face the same situation with respect to their advanced cancer. Having exhausted all standard treatment options, they each enroll in an early-phase trial of an experimental drug, understanding the 1% chance that it will help them, but each having a strong desire for a “miracle cure.” Both hope for the miracle. But Alan doesn’t seem to hope as much as Bess does, despite (ex hypothesi) an equal probability assignment and equally strong desire for the cure. For instance, he will say his motivation for joining the trial is to help people in the future, whereas Bess will say she is motivated by that slim chance of a cure. Martin says that Bess “hopes against hope,” whereas Alan’s hope is of a more ordinary sort. But what can account for the difference in their hopes, given the same strength of desire and same probability of a cure? The orthodox approach, with its two elements, cannot explain this.

Martin’s revision of the orthodox account of hope includes the traditional desire and probability components, but adds what Martin terms the “incorporation” element: in justifying their hopeful activities, hopeful people “incorporate” their desire into their agency as a reason. The incorporation element in turn has two parts. First, a hopeful person takes the probability of the hoped-for outcome as licensing her to adopt her desire for the outcome as a reason to engage in hopeful activities (such as fantasizing, making plans, feeling optimistic, etc.). Second, the hopeful person then adopts this desire (and the desirable features of the outcome) as a reason for her activities. I take it that this incorporation need not be conscious and deliberate, at least initially, but is rather a reconstruction of what’s going on when we hope, accessible to us upon reflection. Otherwise, I’m not sure the account matches the phenomenology of finding oneself hoping for something.

To defend this account of hope, Martin focuses on the rational norms governing the components of hope. The desire component of hope, Martin argues, is not governed by norms at all. Theoretical norms show up in the probability component, in that it is irrational to assign a probability to the hoped-for outcome that is unwarranted by the evidence. Practical norms show up in the incorporation element.

Martin describes the first component of the incorporation element, the licensing stance, as a practical attitude that is not intrinsically motivational; instead, this attitude enables one to adopt other, intrinsically motivational attitudes. She argues that the licensing stance is governed by practical norms in that it is responsive to “considerations of rational ends promotion.” In adopting it, she claims, a person deliberates about what to do with the information contained in her probability assignment. What attitude should Bess or Alan have toward the 1% chance of a cure? Just what sort of activity is reasonably based on this slim chance? Martin claims that the answers to these questions have to do with how this small chance fits with the other rational ends they have. For some, it may license making plans for the future; for others, merely fantasies.

Martin is careful to note that the licensing stance does not make a person see the probability itself as providing practical reasons; rather, the probability licenses other considerations (e.g., the desire for the outcome) to provide reasons. But it is up to the agent whether or not to adopt these considerations as reasons. Martin thus adopts a dualistic view of motivation: we have both the capacity to be attracted to outcomes and the capacity to treat attractions (or other considerations) as practical reasons, and these are distinct capacities. She contends that only this dualistic view can show how we can be held accountable for our decisions to treat or not treat our bare motivations as reasons for action. In Bess’s case, for instance, she is treating her desire for a cure as a reason to be optimistic, and we can ask her why this is justified in light of how slim the chance really is. She will be able to give an account of her choice, though, perhaps along the lines of “I know it’s just a remote chance, but using this chance to stay optimistic is the only way I’m going to hold myself together.”

Having set out the details of her account, Martin goes on to discuss how the incorporation view handles the common claim that hope has a special kind of sustaining power in the context of a trial. The sustaining power is not necessarily power to overcome the trial (it may not be within one’s power to do so), but to find a new way of living well given the trial. Martin argues that although it is too much to claim that hope has a unique motivational power, neither is it merely adding “oomph” to motivations we already have. She contends that the sorts of fantasies a hopeful person takes to be justified can, when we represent ourselves as active in them, influence our sense of overall agency, and from there influence the ends we set and how we pursue them (86). Now, these avenues of sustenance are available on the orthodox view as well. Martin argues that her incorporation analysis is a better account of this sustenance because the justification the hopeful person is ready to offer of her fantasies and feelings make them more likely to be strong and stable, and thus more likely to influence her agency. Not only this, however. Such fantasies may also cause the hopeful person to notice new details that cause her to adjust (either up or down) her dedication to the hoped-for outcome. On the incorporation analysis, these details may add reasons for (or against) the hope. Thus Martin’s account goes beyond merely seconding preexisting motivations, but it is not a special motivational force that increases one’s power to overcome obstacles.

The incorporation structure of hope on Martin’s account allows her to explicate the sense in which a secular faith is a more-confident variant of hope. The central example is of Crow Chief Plenty Coups’ “unimaginable” hope for a new way of life for his people in the face of European encroachment, which spelled the impossibility of continuing to define Crow life through its traditional avenues of hunting and warring with other tribes. This hope is “unimaginable” in the sense that Plenty Coups could not see how such a new way of life could be possible, but nevertheless maintained an unshakeable hope -- i.e., faith -- that it was. Such unimaginable hopes, Martin claims, are not vulnerable to demotivating factors when the hopeful person recognizes the outcome as unimaginable. Since there can be no attempts to fantasize about the outcome, there is likewise nothing that it looks like for this fantasy to become less likely, and hence no reason to lessen hope. Similarly, an unimaginable hope is immune to empirical disappointment, again because the unimaginability of the outcome dictates that nothing in experience can count as decisively countervailing that outcome.

Martin turns to Kant in order to show how this “meta-confidence” -- the invulnerability of the hope to countervailing reasons -- can be warranted. The idea is that “genuinely unimaginable hope has a special kind of theoretical or epistemic rational license” (101) in that, because there is no possibility of evidence either way regarding the outcome, the hopeful person will never have reason to give up the hope. Thus, theoretical reason licenses other types of justification, namely practical justification, for relying on the outcome. In Kant’s case, the discussion targets the possibility of our immortality and the existence of God. We might wonder why we should rely on Kant here, but Martin’s point is that Kant’s discussion of moral faith in God shows how to structure an argument about any unimaginable hope.

Martin then embarks on a discussion of Gabriel Marcel’s conception of hope in order to answer the question whether there is such a thing as secular faith. I’m not quite clear on why there’s a question here, since the Plenty Coups example fits the bill nicely -- although his faith was as a matter of fact religious, the story doesn’t seem to lose anything if the vision on which he based his hope was not seen in religious terms. My confusion here is strengthened by the fact that Martin herself later makes this very observation.

Perhaps the most significant contribution this book makes to moral psychology is contained in Chapter 5, where Martin addresses what she calls “normative hope,” an attitude anyone with children may recognize, one related to Strawson’s reactive attitudes and the stronger “normative expectation” with which they go hand in hand.

Martin argues that normative expectation and normative hope are both ways to relate to someone as a reasoner, i.e., “to treat her in a way that relies on her capacity to reason, but also to stand ready to exchange reasons with her” (122). One way of doing this is to hold her to norms. Martin discusses a handful of examples meant to illustrate the differences between normative expectation and normative hope. One is that of a teenager who has lied to her father about where she’s spending Friday night. The father might at first get angry, exhibiting some combination of resentment and indignation toward his daughter’s behavior. This reaction would suggest that he normatively expects her to be truthful with him. But he may go on to reflect that under the circumstances he’s expecting too much of her -- so that she’s not really a fully competent reasoner, and expecting her to behave better may be asking too much. Under this reflection, his feelings may retreat from anger to disappointment. Such a feeling can still be warranted, because his daughter might have been able to make a better choice. As Martin puts it, normative hope “is a way of treating a principle as worth aspiring to, without insisting on compliance” (130). We typically feel gratitude when people fulfill our hopes, which contrasts with our feeling nothing special when they fulfill our expectations.

Martin argues that normative hope has the same structure as “mundane” hope, i.e., as involving an attraction to a person’s conforming to a norm, believing that this conformity is achievable, seeing this achievability as licensing the treatment of the attraction as reasons to feel interpersonal disappointment or gratitude, and then actually treating conformity (or lack thereof) as a reason for these attitudes.

Normative hope is, Martin claims, valuable because of the role it can play in developing and shaping agency. It is also intrinsically valuable because it helps to constitute meaning in human relationships, tying us to one another. Normative hope is, then, a way of aspiring for ourselves and others to be better agents, “more sensitive and responsive to interpersonal norms, and more skilled at determining when and how our passive natures should influence our actions” (145).

Martin concludes with some general lessons to draw from her analysis of hope -- among them that the dualist account of motivation and the incorporation analysis it enables are useful for analyzing many other features of moral psychology, such as love. I agree, and I believe that this is another strength of the account.

On the whole the incorporation view does a good job of accounting for the ways and degrees we can feel hope. One question that arose for me, however, was what we should make of the idea of resisting hope. We can imagine Alan saying “I can’t help hoping that this drug will provide a cure after all,” which seems to be an acknowledgment that (a) he has hope and (b) he doesn’t think, or perhaps is afraid to think, that hope is warranted. But on the incorporation analysis the only part of hope that we are supposed to be unable to help is the desire part -- the licensing stance and subsequent incorporation of the desire as a reason are supposed to be, if not deliberate, at least reason-governed endeavors. So how should we understand “I can’t help hoping”? One possibility is that this is merely an expression of the strength of the desire component, not to be taken literally. But why, then, say that he can’t help hoping, rather than wishing or wanting? It would be a problem for the incorporation account if hope could be recalcitrant in the sense that there were a sense in which Alan found himself taking his desire for a cure as a reason to make future plans but thinking this unwarranted. Should we say this is simply weakness of will? Or is it that this sort of hope goes wrong by failing to promote rational ends -- if so, which ones? I would be interested to hear Martin’s responses to these questions, because I believe her account is interesting and promising and deserves serious consideration.