How We Understand Others: Philosophy and Social Cognition

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Shannon Spaulding, How We Understand Others: Philosophy and Social Cognition, Routledge, 2018, 105pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138221581.

Reviewed by Joshua Shepherd, Carleton University/University of Barcelona


In the parlance, mindreading involves sociocognitive capacities primarily directed towards understanding (predicting, explaining) others via attribution of propositional attitudes, and secondarily directed towards the purposes of influencing and interacting with minded others. Shannon Spaulding has written a short, accessible, intriguing book about mindreading. She covers leading positions on the nature of mindreading, convincingly notes their various limitations, and illuminates ways to move beyond these limitations. A major theme is that much philosophical work on mindreading has been myopic, focusing primarily on the ways that we attribute beliefs in order to explain and predict behavior. But mindreading is variegated, and far more interesting. Spaulding argues that philosophical work on it should aim to explain this diversity.

After introducing the book's themes, Spaulding reviews the mindreading literature. The upshot of this review is that standard views of mindreading -- competing families that fall under the headings "theory-theory" and "simulation-theory" -- are motivated by a view on the importance of mindreading that can be challenged. The view is that 'mindreading is the primary, pervasive way we understand others, that mindreading is essential for navigating the social world, and that we could not understand and interact in our social environments as successfully and easily as we do if we were not avid mindreaders' (8-9). The challenge comes from a few directions. But the one Spaulding finds most plausible involves appeal to the many ways we have of understanding, influencing, and interacting with others beyond the attribution of propositional attitudes to them. Proponents of standard views give 'far too little attention to trait attributions, stereotypes, behavioral schemata, and the way in which we employ these folk psychological tools to regulate our own and others' behavior' (16).

Spaulding views this as an opportunity for, rather than a devastating objection to, standard views. She further develops the idea that standard views have been myopic, and that a version of theory-theory called Model Theory is the best way forward. The driving idea is that our mindreading capacities depend heavily on the models of others' minds that we build, and that these models are the things we need to understand -- how they are constructed, and what their key parameters are.

Spaulding argues that standard views treat mindreaders as relatively pristine epistemic agents engaged in processes that aim to get the minds of others right. But in real-life interaction we rely on background social categories, as well as ready-to-hand heuristics and biases, to rapidly sort people into easier-to-handle pods. Unfortunately, 'easier-to-handle' is not necessarily an epistemic modifier.

The sky, however, gets cloudier still when Spaulding argues mindreading processes are driven by a variety of goals -- 'accuracy is not always a primary concern' (42). There is evidence that accuracy may guide mindreading to a greater degree in some conditions: for example, when stakes are high, or in conditions of violated expectations. But Spaulding discusses evidence that in some cases, we behave as if guided by features like 'anxiety reduction, self-esteem protection, and confirmation of one's opinions' (44). The stereotypes and social categories Spaulding introduced earlier return here. For in conditions of cognitive load, or when confronted by out-group members, we seem to rely on such stereotypes. Doing so may serve -- or rather, may have served -- evolutionary purposes just fine, but it undermines accuracy to serve goals often opaque to us. Further, and raising moral hackles for most, Spaulding observes that these ways of interacting with others package in various self or in-group-serving biases.

Next, building on work by Peter Godfrey-Smith (2005) and Heidi Maibom (2003, 2009), Spaulding offers Model Theory as a way to regiment the panoply of influences upon mindreading processes. We are told that 'Model Theory has the potential to be a comprehensive, unified, and plausible account of mindreading' (68) -- where mindreading here must include the diverse set of inputs and outputs Spaulding criticized mainstream views for ignoring. How can Model Theory get this done?

On Spaulding's Model Theory 'mindreading consists in deploying a model psychological profile of a target' (68). These models are systems of interrelated concepts. The mechanisms that build them are claimed to generate at least some proprietary structure:

There is a basic folk psychological model, which consists in a distinction between beliefs and desires, the idea of sensory input and behavioral output, and characteristic dependence of action on perceptions, memories, goals, and temptations. Elements of this core folk psychological model are innately specified, which explains why basic aspects of folk psychology appear to be common across cultures. (69)

Critics of Model Theory may wonder how this advances the debate. The idea is that thinking of mindreading processes as structured by models permits a greater range of inputs and outputs. But one might have questions about how best to interpret the function of the various modelling mechanisms, especially since a main point of Spaulding's is that mindreading can be driven by a range of different goals, only one of which is accuracy.

Spaulding touts the flexibility of these models in accommodating the range of data. So, 'the mindreading models we employ can be more or less elaborate, with some being mere schema we generate on the fly and others being detailed representations of individuals and social groups' (69). But one wonders what rules dictate the differences, and whether the data we have is adequate to underpin accounts of such rules. What are we really up to when we build models of others? Critics of mainstream mindreading theories may worry that we are not primarily building models of minds as populated by propositional attitudes. Perhaps we are primarily concerned to enforce behavioral rules we only tacitly understand, for reasons that largely escape us. Perhaps we are primarily engaged in mindshaping (see, e.g., Zawidzki 2013).

A distinction Spaulding offers is relevant to this set of worries. On the one hand we have model construction. On the other we have model use: 'the very same model may be used to categorize behavior, confirm a stereotype, or make rough-and-ready predictions about what a target will do' (70). But -- given the subterranean nature of the operation of many of the factors Spaulding discussed earlier -- I wish this book had more discussion, or appealed to more evidence illuminating, how we might draw this distinction. When do the models of others we build deserve the title 'mindreading,' and why? Why think that we have much control over our use of these models, and if not, what are the principles by which we individuate models?

Perhaps the evidence is too scanty. And perhaps Spaulding's criticism of the narrowness of much work on mindreading comes back to bite. For Spaulding observes that 'little attention is paid to developments in mindreading after the preschool years' (72). And yet understanding these processes, and whether a distinction between model construction and model use is viable in many cases, will likely depend upon work done on post-preschoolers.

In light of Spaulding's discussion one may be tempted by the following view. We represent our attributions of psychological properties to others as truth-tracking, when in fact they are only rarely that. Our attributions are shot through with processes not under our control, that serve other masters. The literatures on biases in social categorization tell us something about these masters, as may the psychology of dehumanization, and other work besides (in, e.g., social anthropology). The result: we know others far less well than we think, and while we may be able to overcome (some of) our deficiencies in this regard, the data on how is thus far limited.

Spaulding next considers ways a more stereoscopic view of mindreading might be relevant for ancillary, normative philosophical debates in ethics and epistemology. She considers two: the epistemology of peer disagreement, and the ethics of epistemic (in)justice. Her aim is not to argue for a particular view in those debates, but to suggest a direction of influence from how one understands the nature of mindreading processes to how one should view these normative matters. The discussion is interesting, and one would hope those active in these debates would capitalize on the direction of influence Spaulding suggests. Analogous progress has been made by the application of the science of agency to debates surrounding the moral psychology of agency. There is no reason to doubt something similar could take place for discussion of peer disagreement, the nature of epistemic peers, and the structure of epistemic injustice. Indeed, although Spaulding does not mention it, and few have done any connective work on this particular front, accounts of mindreading strike me as relevant to the moral psychology of agency as well. After all, our praising and blaming practices are dependent on the ways we interpret the minds of others.

Those familiar with Spaulding's work will be unsurprised that throughout the book she displays mastery of the relevant literatures, philosophical and empirical, that her discussion is crisp, and that her ideas are interesting. This book would serve well in an upper-level philosophy course that covers social cognition. Given the close interplay between philosophers and psychologists in this area I think it would be an excellent choice for psychology or cognitive science courses as well.


Work on this review was supported by ERC Starting Grant ReConAgĀ 757698, towards the project Rethinking Conscious Agency.


Godfrey-Smith, P. 2005. Folk psychology as a model. Philosophers' Imprint 5(6): 1-16.

Maibom, H. 2003. The mindreader and the scientist. Mind and Language 18(3): 296-315.

Maibom, H. 2009. In defense of (model) theory theory. Journal of Consciousness Studies 16(6-8): 360-378.

Zawidzki, T. 2013. Mindshaping: A New Framework for Understanding Human Social Cognition. MIT Press.