Human Action in Thomas Aquinas, John Duns Scotus and William of Ockham

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Thomas M. Osborne Jr., Human Action in Thomas Aquinas, John Duns Scotus and William of Ockham, The Catholic University of America Press, 2014, 250pp., $59.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780813221786.

Reviewed by Thomas Williams, University of South Florida


This is an ambitious book. Covering the topic of human action in high medieval philosophy requires one to discuss a great variety of issues: mental causation, the powers of the soul and their interrelationship, the nature of freedom and moral responsibility, how practical reason guides action, and what makes actions good or bad. Looking at not just one, but three great thinkers of the period brings further difficulties: taking account of the vast and contentious scholarly literature on Thomas Aquinas, grappling with the disarray in which Scotus's texts have come down to us, and making something out of Ockham's relatively brief treatments of most of the principal questions. So it is very much to Thomas M. Osborne Jr.'s credit that he attempted this ambitious task, and that he has largely succeeded in what he set out to do.

Chapter 1, "Causes of the Act," examines the three thinkers' accounts of the causal contributions of will and intellect to human actions as well as their understanding of what grounds or accounts for freedom in human action. For Aquinas, it is the will that actually brings about a human action; the intellect, by presenting an object in a particular way, accounts for the content of the act, its being one sort of act rather than another. To put those claims in Scholastic vocabulary, the will is the efficient cause and the intellect the formal cause of an action. Scotus (sometimes) and Ockham (always) ascribe some efficient causality to the intellect, though for both of them the will must be the more important efficient cause, because freedom is rooted in the will's capacity for opposites. For Aquinas, by contrast, freedom is rooted in the intellect's capacity to judge different particular goods as means to (or ways of realizing) happiness and to judge one and the same good in different ways. As Osborne astutely observes, the complexity of this history means that the standard categories of "intellectualism" and "voluntarism" prove to be of limited use in organizing these debates conceptually and historically.

Chapter 2, "Practical Reason," discusses both the nature of practical reasoning and its role in producing action. Here the views taken by the three thinkers are too complex to summarize, but the animating questions are: What exactly makes a piece of thinking practical as opposed to speculative? How is moral science distinguished from prudence? How does one know the premises of the practical syllogism? Is the conclusion of the practical syllogism an action or a judgment?

In Chapter 3, "The Stages of the Act," Osborne begins by laying out the "basically Aristotelian structure according to which human acts have three major components: willing the end, deliberating concerning the means, and choosing" (109). He then discusses the additional stages or components that Aquinas, Scotus, and Ockham thought were necessary for a full account of human action. Aquinas has the most complex account, with at least eight and possibly as many as twelve stages in all (Osborne declines to give an exact count). The additional acts of intention and consent, Osborne argues, do not detract from the centrality of willing, deliberation, and choice, but simply allow Aquinas to present a fuller picture of a basically Aristotelian account of action. By contrast, the "addition of command and use extends the description of the act to include an element of the act that Aristotle does not address, namely its execution" (130). Scotus focuses on choice as the locus of freedom and moral responsibility; he shows much less interest than Aquinas in elaborating a complex structure or series of stages in action. Ockham clearly differentiates six stages: "(1) the presentation of the end by the intellect, (2) the willing of the end, (3) deliberation, (4) judgment, (5) choice, and (6) execution" (141).

Chapter 4 examines the "Evaluation and Specification of the Act": that is, what makes a particular act good or bad and what makes an act the kind of act it is. The exposition here is made more difficult by the fact that Aquinas, Scotus, and Ockham use much of the same vocabulary but not always with the same meanings. Aquinas emphasizes the object as the crucial determinant of both the species and the goodness of particular acts. (The object means the object-as-relevantly-characterized-by-reason: the object of my act of taking is not just $100, but $100-belonging-to-an-unwitting-stranger or $100-of-my-own-money. The question of which characterizations make for moral differences in the object and which do not, and why that is, is not examined here.) Some acts are specifically good (good according to their type) because their objects are inherently agreeable to reason, though a particular act-token is fully good only if allits features are agreeable to reason. For Scotus, no act, other than the act of loving God, is good merely on account of its object. Ockham includes right reason as a secondary partial object of intrinsically virtuous acts. Only interior acts (acts of the will itself) can be intrinsically virtuous; by way of contrast with Aquinas and Scotus, Ockham ascribes no independent moral worth to exterior acts (the bodily acts that the will commands by way of executing its choice).

Chapter 5, "Indifferent, Good, and Meritorious Acts," continues the discussion of the goodness of acts. Aquinas argues that some kinds of acts are morally neither good nor bad; their objects are neither inherently agreeable nor inherently repugnant to reason. But any particular act is either morally good or morally bad, because by definition every actual human act is chosen for the sake of an end, and the end (along with the other circumstances that characterize the act) will be either reasonable or not. Scotus, by contrast, holds that some particular acts are morally indifferent, arguing (at least in some texts) that "acts can be chosen without morally relevant ends" (198). Ockham emphasizes the indifference of exterior acts, but interior acts, too, can be morally indifferent.

One of the many merits of this book is that although his discussions are informed by extensive reading in the secondary literature, Osborne tries as far as possible to expound the material directly from the texts rather than through the lens of scholarly debates. This laudable approach is somewhat compromised, however, by Osborne's occasional practice of announcing the existence of scholarly controversies and then declining to adjudicate them. For example, does Aquinas think the proper act of prudence is imperium or the iudicium electionis? (72) Does Scotus think the goodness of the contingent precepts of the moral law derives entirely from God's will or depends in part on "prior considerations of justice"? (85) In other cases Osborne seems to take a side on a contested issue without fully acknowledging either the controversy or the fact that his exposition tends toward one side of the dispute. The best example of this comes in Chapter 1, when Osborne explains the causal role of intellect and will in Aquinas. Interpreters disagree sharply over whether Aquinas thinks the will has any power of its own to shape human action or (to put the matter in different terms) whether there is any freedom or indeterminacy in human volition that is not traceable to the intellect. Osborne's account suggests a position in this debate without fully acknowledging that there is a debate and that his exposition tends toward one side of it. At several points one gets the impression that he thinks the will does have some independent causal power to shape action. Even a small detail like the translation of fertur as 'respond' in the following quotation from ST I-II 10.2 is telling here: "If however some object is presented to it that is not good from every point of view, the will does not respond to it out of necessity" (11). 'Respond' is active: the will does something, or doesn't do something, on its own steam, as it were. But fertur is passive. If we translate accordingly -- "the will is not drawn to it out of necessity" -- the picture is that the will is carried along, or not carried along, to an object depending entirely on how the intellect judges it.

It is in this context that the worry that Aquinas is a compatibilist or intellectual determinist -- a worry that Osborne tends to see as simply misplaced (16-17, 19-20, 30-31, 36, 59) -- arises. Take this picture of the will as carried along to an object depending entirely on how the intellect judges, and combine that with the idea that how the intellect judges an object in a fully determinate set of circumstances is itself fully determinate: then it really does begin to look as if Aquinas is something like a compatibilist or intellectual determinist. Osborne seems to think that such worries are misplaced because (a) the intellect's causality is formal rather than efficient and (b) by definition an act of will cannot be causally determined (16-17). But (a) does not in fact help: if the possibilities for action in a fully determinate set of circumstances are narrowed down to one by the interplay of formal (intellectual) and efficient (volitional) causality, that's no less determinism (in the sense that incompatibilists worry about) than if the possibilities are narrowed down to one by efficient causality alone. And (b) is simply false, resting as it does on a conflation (quite common in the scholarly literature) between Aquinas's claim that an act of will cannot be subject to necessity of coercion and the claim that an act of will cannot be causally determined. The former claim neither is equivalent to nor entails the latter, and Aquinas nowhere makes the latter claim.

There are some inaccuracies in the exposition of Scotus. For example, Osborne says that Scotus's definition of praxis "limits praxis to those acts that have been chosen correctly" (81). It does not.1 What Scotus actually says is that praxis encompasses those acts that (given the sorts of acts they are) should be elicited in conformity with a correct intellectual judgment, not those that in fact are so elicited. The relevant part of the Latin is praxis . . . est actus . . . natus elici conformiter intellectioni rectae ad hoc ut sit recta; Osborne's reading would require elicitus for natus elici. He says that Scotus thinks "different actions require that there be different judgments by the intellect" (58), which is simply false. He claims that the contingent precepts of the natural law "have their force insofar as they are in harmony with precepts that are known through their terms" (85). In fact, however, though it is true that the contingent precepts are in harmony with the necessary precepts -- that's why the contingent precepts can be accounted part of the natural law, though in a looser sense -- those precepts have their force because of the divine will. Somewhat trickier to evaluate is Osborne's statement that "unlike Thomas, Scotus thinks that almsgiving lacks specific goodness" (168). The passage that Osborne cites in support of this claim (Ord. 2, d. 7, q. un.) has Scotus saying that almsgiving has generic goodness, which he defines in very much the same way that Aquinas defines specific goodness (goodness from the object; cf. 155); Scotus uses "specific goodness" (also "goodness from circumstances" and "complete goodness") to describe the goodness that an act has when, as Aquinas puts it, "all the goodnesses concur in it" (ST I-II 18.4). On this last point, then, the difference between Aquinas and Scotus is purely terminological.

Osborne's treatment of the material is encyclopedic in both good and bad senses. It is thorough and wide-ranging; it is (as I have already noted) informed by extensive reading in the secondary literature but not bloated by constant engagement with scholarly controversies; it tries to have something to say about all the major topics within the areas it covers. But it also tends to homogenize the material in ways that arguably misrepresent it. Osborne expressly tries to give roughly the same amount and kind of attention to both Scotus and Ockham that he gives to Aquinas (xxi), even though Aquinas is far more prolific and far more systematic in his discussion of human action than Scotus and Ockham are.

Moreover, the fact that every discussion begins with Aquinas tends to make Aquinas's views seem like the default, any deviation from which requires explanation -- and explanation, inevitably, in (or over against) the terms that Aquinas himself sets. Thus, for example, in Chapter 1 Scotus is represented as differing from Aquinas in holding that it is possible for an intellectual appetite not to be free (21, 26-27, 56), which is a strangely Aquinas-centric way of characterizing Scotus's point. From Scotus's perspective, the dispute is over whether intellectual appetite is free just because it's intellectual, as Aquinas had held; in other words, Scotus thinks that what Aquinas calls freedom isn't really freedom at all, for Scotus has precisely the worries about intellectual determinism that I described above. Similarly, in Chapter 3, the fact (I shall accept arguendo that it is a fact, though I do not myself accept this all-but-universal reading of theTreatise on Human Acts) that Aquinas sets forth a number of discrete stages of the human act determines perhaps too much of the agenda for the remainder of the chapter, which is then occupied to a large degree with the project of figuring out how many of Aquinas's stages, and which ones, are retained by Scotus and Ockham -- an approach that unfortunately imposes on their treatments of human acts a shape they wouldn't otherwise take.

Notwithstanding these reservations, there is no denying that Osborne's achievement in this book is impressive. It is a valuable resource for anyone who is interested in the development of medieval accounts of action, freedom, goodness, and practical reason.

1Osborne may owe this claim to Mechthild Dreyer and Mary Beth Ingham, The Philosophical Vision of John Duns Scotus: An Introduction (The Catholic University of America Press, 2004), which he cites in a footnote. Ingham (who wrote the chapter from which I am quoting) says, “The third condition for praxis joins moral desire and choice to the judgment of right reasoning. Praxis is an act of willing in tandem with right reasoning. This means that when an act is not accompanied by right reasoning, it is not praxis”  (Philosophical Vision, 130).