Human Being, Bodily Being: Phenomenology from Classical India

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Chakravarthi Ram-Prasad, Human Being, Bodily Being: Phenomenology from Classical India, Oxford University Press, 2018, 204pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198823629.

Reviewed by Arun Iyer, Indian Institute of Technology Bombay


Chakravarthi Ram-Prasad's provocative book comprises four excellent independent studies in comparative philosophy. Each can be picked up in any order and read independently of the others. Even though these are exercises in comparative philosophy dealing with Indian thought and mainly 20th century Western thought, especially phenomenology, the Indian texts Ram-Prasad has chosen are not from the standard classical Indian philosophical cannon. You will not find texts such as Śaṅkara's Brahmasutra Bhāṣya or Nagarjuna's Mūlamadhyamakakārikā. Rather Ram-Prasad has chosen an eclectic group of texts, which are not part of the philosophical cannon at all. The texts are the Caraka Saṃhitā, which is a text on medicine; a dialogue from the epic Mahābhārata; the Buddhist text Visuddhimagga by Buddhaghosa on the techniques of meditation; and an erotic canto (no. XVIII) from the poem Naiṣadhacarita by Śrī Harṣa. Each of the four central chapters is a detailed study of one of the four texts. Given spatial constraints and the book's overall richness, this review will focus mainly on its philosophical underpinnings rather than on the philological arguments Ram-Prasad marshals to make his larger philosophical point.

This larger philosophical point is the common theme running through all of the studies -- that of embodiment. Each of these studies is meant to bring out certain facets of what Ram-Prasad calls bodiliness. Taken together they are meant to inaugurate a new chapter in phenomenology, which Ram-Prasad labels ecological phenomenology. Ecological phenomenology is neither supposed to be an ontological nor a metaphysical enterprise. It is founded upon texts, which according to Ram-Prasad, avoid the dualism of mind and body, subject and object that has been a feature of Western thought since Descartes. Cartesian dualism has engendered an ontological priority of the subject over the object, of the mind over the body. With Descartes, the body and the object, whose existence can be forever questioned, become the names of a problem.

This problem is to be solved by accounting for their relationship to their counterparts -- the mind and the subject respectively -- whose existence is established beyond any doubt. The body is thus accorded secondary status, even banished to the margins of philosophy. Ram-Prasad characterizes this as 'Cartesian shock' or the 'Cartesian crisis.' Physicalism is one attempt to escape this crisis, which reduces the mental to the physical. Phenomenology is another attempt to escape it without succumbing to a reductionism of any kind. This is particularly true of the work of Merleau-Ponty, whom Ram-Prasad distinguishes from all the other phenomenologists, due to Merleau-Ponty's emphasis on the body and his sustained attempts to do justice to the body. However, despite phenomenology's attempt to overcome Cartesian dualism, phenomenology (even the phenomenology of Merleau-Ponty) is still caught in its shadow because it takes the two independent ontological realms of the mental and the physical as its starting point and tries to bridge this ontological divide through the human body. The human body is thus only an intermediary between the mental and physical in the work of Merleau-Ponty, according to Ram-Prasad's reading. The ontological gap between the mental and the physical, between subjectivity and objectivity remains unquestioned.

By contrast, the Indian texts that Ram-Prasad choses do not presuppose this ontological divide between mind and body and can thus do justice to the body on its own terms. Hence one can isolate in them senses of the mind and body not numbed by what he calls the shock of Cartesianism. Ram-Prasad attempts to show us how each of these texts is an exercise in phenomenology avant la lettre. However, he distinguishes this phenomenology with a small 'p' from what calls phenomenology with a capital 'P.' The former only has a methodological overlap with the latter and rejects the latter's metaphysical and ontological basis, namely, Cartesian dualism. Ram-Prasad approvingly quotes David Carr's defense of transcendental philosophy as a critique of metaphysics and science, which is not a theory but a research programme or a method for interrogating everyday experience and exposing its deepest assumptions. (17) It is on this idea of a method that ecological phenomenology is grounded.

Here we need to say a word about the adjective 'ecological.' The word 'ecology' is usually found in discussions about the natural environment. We speak of 'ecological disasters,' for instance. But Ram-Prasad uses the term 'ecology' in a broader sense to mean the discursive context of a certain experience, which is constituted by the literature within which that experience is articulated, the intellectual and social background against which it gains salience. Phenomenology becomes ecological for the simple reason that it is sensitive to the context of experience and sees experience as situated in a world. Hence phenomenology with a small 'p,' which refuses to bracket the world as Ram-Prasad claims Husserlian phenomenology does. (106)

Ram-Prasad attempts to show how these Indian texts grant us a new sense of bodiliness, a sense that is not affected by Cartesian dualism's strict separation of body and mind. On the contrary, in these texts the boundaries between body and mind are blurred. The body encompasses properties that would, within a Cartesian context, belong to the realm of the mental and vice versa. In a similar fashion in the Indian texts, subject and object imply each other; there is no strict separation between the two. No ontological priority can be claimed by one over the other. The human subject thus cannot be conceived as anything but bodily. The discussions in these texts, Ram-Prasad argues, do not begin with the separation of body and mind into two distinct realms. In the passages from the Caraka Saṃhitā discussed in the second chapter, the terms 'mind' and 'body' emerge as functions of the discourse between doctor and patient, both of whom are situated in a social milieu and in constant interaction with it.

Similarly, in defending her mode of life as an ascetic, Sulabhā's defense displays an articulation of the human body, which is again not strictly restricted to materiality. It encompasses several characteristics attributed to the mental. In the same way, the mind too is understood as something physical, not as an entity distinct from the physical. Similar blurring of the boundaries between the mental and the physical, between subjectivity and objectivity happen in the texts by Buddhaghosa and Śrī Harṣa. Ram-Prasad shows how mind and body become functions of their respective discourses and play different roles and encompass different aspects in relation to the discourse at play. This is because the distinctions "are analytic elements of the ecology of experience and are not to be posited as ontological elements." (107)

The exegeses of the four texts are compelling, and Ram-Prasad is successful in showing us their contemporary relevance. This is especially the case with the third chapter in which he confronts the debates in feminist philosophy to forcefully show the relevance of Sulabhā's argument as an independent position in these debates to be taken seriously in its own right. This alone is enough to recommend the book.

As we have seen already, this book is meant to be an illustration of phenomenology in classical India. But a question needs to be raised about the use of the term 'phenomenology' throughout this book. Ram-Prasad has multiple meanings for the term and it is not always clear which he using. To cite a few examples, on p. 50, he speaks of the bodily subject as "a phenomenology-possessing being." On p. 72, he contrasts the physical with the phenomenological by speaking of the "lack of complete contiguity between the physical and the phenomenological." On p. 98, we see him refer to "Sulabhā's reconfiguration of her gendered phenomenology." On p. 101, he equates the 'objective' with the 'non-phenomenological' and the 'lived' with the 'phenomenological.' How are we to tie these myriad references with the understanding of phenomenology as a method to interrogate experience?

Ram-Prasad's philosophical arguments would have benefitted from a deeper engagement with the original works of some of the prominent phenomenologists, especially Husserl and Merleau-Ponty. In many instances Ram-Prasad lets the secondary literature stand for the original when the original needed to be engaged with. This is particularly urgent when one is inaugurating a new approach to phenomenology, not merely working with existing approaches.

I would like to conclude by raising two concerns, one pertaining to Western philosophy and the other to Indian philosophy. If we go by the cited definition of phenomenology as transcendental philosophy, as a critique of everyday experience, of which phenomenology is an instance, then it is not very clear if this function of critique is fulfilled by these different texts and whether they can lay claim to the title of phenomenology. In what sense do they really show us the underlying deep prejudices and presuppositions that buttress this experience? All these exegeses painstakingly illustrate that our understanding of the mind and body are merely a function of those deep prejudices and presuppositions, which constitute the ecology of our everyday experience, which we can never jettison. As the presuppositions vary from experience to experience along with the discourses based upon those experiences, so will the content of terms 'body' and 'mind,' as a result of which there is no fixed referent for any of these terms. The body acquires a different sense in medical diagnosis, in meditation, in the justification of one's existence as a woman, in erotic love. It is merely a function of the many experiences, of the many discourses and thus of the several prejudices in which we participate. Whereas, the entire aim of phenomenology is to make us aware of those presuppositions so we can overcome them and in so doing go back to the things themselves to see how things really are, even if this is a never-ending task. This is what Husserl seems to mean when he talks about the transition from the natural to the phenomenological attitude by bracketing the world. It is not meant to be a negation of the world but the negation of its everyday meaning so we can come to an understanding of its real meaning. Bereft of any such real meaning of the 'body' and 'mind,' abandoned to the many discourses which populate our existence, do we not have to succumb to a radical relativism where terms body, mind, subject, object are not anchored in anything other than the prejudices and presuppositions of the moment?

As to Indian philosophy, Ram-Prasad is absolutely correct to state that the dualism of mind and body has no salience in Indian thought if we rightly take mind to represent thought or the capacity for thought and body to represent extension or an extended thing. However, there is another kind of dualism in classical orthodox Indian thought. This is not the dualism of thought and extension but rather of the self [ātman] understood as pure quiescence understood metaphorically as dreamless sleep and the chaos of activity, both mental and bodily. It is in response to this that the heterodox school of Buddhism espouses anātmavāda, the doctrine of no-self. The school of Advaita Vedānta that espouses a monism, granting reality only to the self [ātman] that is identified with the ultimate reality [brahman], can also be seen as a major response to this dualism. Ram-Prasad himself quotes passages from the Caraka Saṃhitā, which make this dualism a point of reference. This dualism is also implied in Sulabhā's argument when she puts both mind and body on the side of prakṛti but does not speak of puruṣa in that context, which is again the self as pure quiescence. Ram-Prasad never quite succeeds in dispelling this dualism from these texts. We can indeed say that all of the four texts have definitely escaped the dualism of mind and body. However, they continue to lie in the shadow of the dualism of quiescence and activity, of the self and the mind-body, which implies a metaphysical or ontological gap similar to that between the mind and the body.