Human Dignity and Human Rights

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Pablo Gilabert, Human Dignity and Human Rights, Oxford University Press, 2018, 349pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198827221.

Reviewed by Kristen Hessler, University at Albany (SUNY)


Pablo Gilabert's book defends a systematic account of human dignity as the foundational concept in his theory of moral human rights and social justice. Part I considers three ground-clearing issues in the philosophy of human rights: the debate between moral and political approaches to human rights; whether socioeconomic rights meet the threshold of feasibility required to be considered moral human rights; and the various challenges for human rights theory and practice stemming from the existence of deep power imbalances in the world. Addressing these issues sets the stage for Gilabert's articulation and defense of his "dignitarian approach" in Part II. Part III draws out the implications of this approach, defending both labor rights and a right to democracy as moral human rights, as well as sketching the "arc of humanist justice" -- that is, the continuity between moral human rights and social justice more broadly, both of which (Gilabert argues) can be productively grounded in human dignity.

Gilabert does an admirable job of defending the idea of human dignity as an important idea in human rights practice, and in making the case that philosophers should pay more attention to it. He carefully documents the prominent references to human dignity in the United Nations Charter and the International Bill of Human Rights (comprised by the Universal Declaration of Human Rights (UCHR), the International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights (ICCPR), and the International Covenant on Social, Cultural, and Economic Rights (ICESCR)). From this starting point, he builds an account of human dignity that he regards as a "deliberative interpretive proposal," which he describes as a kind of midway point between a mere description of the idea found in the practice, and a stipulation regarding what that idea ought to be (118).

As part of this proposal, Gilabert develops a taxonomy of human dignity that systematizes common intuitions about dignity into a coherent account that is both illuminating and useful. For example, one key distinction within this taxonomy obtains between status-dignity and condition-dignity. Status-dignity is "a deontic normative status, a moral standing, of human individuals such that every agent who can affect them ought to treat them in certain respectful and concernful ways," while condition-dignity is a "state of affairs in which dignitarian norms are fulfilled" (122, 124). This distinction enables Gilabert to make sense of the fact that while human dignity is often cited as a reason for ensuring that human beings are not subjected to certain forms of treatment (such as enslavement), it is at the same time often said that enslavement and similar conditions "destroy" human dignity. At first glance, it seems that these two uses of "dignity" -- the first apparently asserting a stable property of human beings that prohibits certain forms of treatment of them, the second seeming to indicate that dignity can be destroyed, or is at least absent, precisely where human beings are treated in those prohibited ways -- are in tension with each other. Using Gilabert's account of dignity, however, we can see that there is no incoherence here. Rather, the first way of speaking refers to status-dignity, the normative standing of humans that forbids certain treatment of them, while the second way of speaking refers to the absence of condition-dignity, which obtains when the kinds of treatment to which creatures with human dignity are entitled are actually realized.

Significantly for his larger argument placing dignity at the center of an account of human rights and social justice, Gilabert's taxonomy also includes the "basis of dignity," which captures what it is about human beings "that makes the application of human rights norms appropriate" (126). He does not specify a determinate account of the basis of dignity, beyond insisting that the correct account must be pluralist rather than monist, and that the features comprising the basis of dignity must be general (relatively invariant among human beings), valuable (e.g., not the human capacity to be cruel), and important (in the sense of contributing significantly to human beings' quality of life) (126). Gilabert sketches a methodology for identifying these features:

The best way to proceed here, I think, is simply to propose a list as a hypothesis, and see how it helps us state, defend, and implement dignitarian norms. We can revise that list (adding or dropping elements, or refining their characterization), as our search for reflective equilibrium about what to think about human rights and social justice unfolds. (127)

Based on these methodological reflections, Gilabert proposes as a "plausible initial hypothesis" an expansive list of the features of human beings that constitute the basis of dignity: "the human capacities for sentience, knowledge, prudential and moral reasoning and choice, aesthetic appreciation, self-awareness, creative production, social cooperation, and sympathy" (127).

Gilabert suggests that the list of components of the basis of dignity "can be assessed and refined as its fruitfulness for the justification of various human rights is explored" (127). However, while he explores some "synergies" between the capabilities approach and the basis of dignity in Ch. 7, and spends two chapters (10 and 11) defending labor rights and rights to democracy as human rights, he doesn't seem to come back around to refining the basis of dignity in a determinate way. This is partly because his justification of labor human rights and a human right to democracy focus more on responding to objections to considering these rights human rights at all (so, on defending the claim that they are human rights) than it does on highlighting the distinctive contribution that the dignitarian approach makes to an account of why they are human rights. Dignity itself comes up less than I expected it to in the chapter on a human right to democracy, for example, and when it does, it is not in a way that is intended to help to clarify the basis of dignity.

This indeterminacy contributes to the impression that while Gilabert's systematic account of human dignity is interesting and compelling in its own right, it's not entirely clear on the whole exactly what unique normative work the concept of human dignity contributes to a theory of human rights, compared to other concepts already familiar in philosophical theories of human rights. For example, he connects the capacities that comprise the basis of dignity with interests: "As it turns out, people have important interests in being able to develop, maintain, and exercise those capacities" (206). While interest-based accounts of moral human rights are already well-established, Gilabert argues that "interest-based theories do not do enough to explain the link between interests and rights," because they do not answer the following question: "Why does a statement about a human interest even prompt us to wonder whether a right to support for its satisfaction exists?" (130). According to Gilabert, answering this question requires a "bridge principle," which "links evaluative claims about what contributes to the decent or flourishing life of people (i.e., about their interests) to deontic claims about what agents ought to do to support them (i.e., certain rights and duties)" (ibid.). He argues that the idea of human dignity provides this bridge:

The idea of human dignity enables the move from interest to rights, operating as a bridging category, because it has both an evaluative component (concerning the valuable features of the basis of dignity) and a deontic component (concerning the character of status-dignity as comprising rights and duties). (206)

In other words: "The features in the basis of dignity simultaneously ground status-dignity, certain interests, and rights to support regarding those interests" (ibid.).

While Gilabert's initial hypothesis about the features comprising the basis of dignity seems expansive enough to ground these other things successfully, it's not obvious why a "bridge principle" is needed. This is not to deny that there is a justificatory gap between interests and moral rights, since not all interests ground moral rights (some may be too trivial to justify imposing duties on others, perhaps). Recognizing this gap, Joseph Raz's interest-based framework for justifying moral rights, for example, designates rights as a middle stage in moral reasoning grounded in human interests, which then play an important role in further reasoning about what duties may justifiably imposed on others on the basis of those rights.[1] In Raz's account, the justificatory "bridge" between interests, moral rights, and their counterpart duties, requires substantive moral argument. Gilabert does not deny that moving from interests to rights to duties involves substantive moral argument, including careful consideration about what duties may be justifiably imposed in the name of rights, but his account unifies this reasoning process under (various aspects of) the idea of human dignity. While this framework provides a helpful umbrella concept to capture this reasoning process, which is undeniably an improvement in theoretical elegance, it's not obvious that this move makes a substantive contribution to our understanding of the moral reasoning necessary to justify moral rights and their counterpart duties, since his account of that justification seems substantively similar to that of other interest-based theories.

In fairness, these points may not amount to much of a criticism of Gilabert's argument for several reasons. First, an important part of his goal here is to argue that his dignitarian approach is a fruitful program grounding a broad range of research in moral and political philosophy, including further attention not only to how specific human rights are justified, but also to how dignity might apply to non-human animals, and other questions about the foundations and application of dignity and duties to respond appropriately to dignity (Ch. 8). He also argues powerfully for his account of "solidaristic empowerment" as a way of capturing both the positive and negative duties to respond in morally appropriate ways to human dignity, which itself is a significant contribution to the broader understanding of moral human rights (Ch. 7). Finally, he consistently argues that the practice of human rights is still taking shape (116); therefore, to the extent that his theory takes as a starting point the elements of human dignity contained within the practice, we should expect it to be somewhat tentative and subject to revision as the practice evolves.

On that note, and given the current prominence of methodological concerns in the philosophy of human rights, Gilabert's strong defense of humanist views (also sometimes called "moral" or "traditional" approaches) over (or perhaps alongside of) political or practical ones is noteworthy in itself. According to his descriptions of these approaches, political views treat human rights as "claims that individuals have against certain institutional structures, in particular modern states, in virtue of interests they have in contexts that include them" (56). Traditional or humanist views, by contrast, regard human rights as "pre-institutional claims that individuals have against all other individuals that can affect them in virtue of interests characteristic of their common humanity" (29). Gilabert argues ultimately that "we need both to make good normative sense of the contemporary practice of human rights" (30), since, in his view, humanist perspectives focus on abstract rights owed to all in virtue of their humanity, while political views focus on specific rights appropriate for institutional contexts like the contemporary states-based international system.

In the course of Gilabert's argument in favor of reconciling the two approaches, however, he seems to conflate two senses in which a view might be political. The first is to apply human rights norms to institutions such as states or international law. This is John Rawls's approach. The second looks to justify specific human rights norms by looking to the practice. Gilabert, taking Charles Beitz's view as representative of political views, identifies political views primarily with the second approach, which explains why he consistently worries that political views tend toward a kind of institutional conventionalism incapable of critical moral reflection on the status quo, and argues that humanist views provide a critical moral perspective on the practice that political views might lack. But this concern about political views sidelines other variants of political approaches to human rights. For example, political theorists such as Rawls agree with Gilabert that human rights have moral content. Indeed, it is the extreme moral urgency of "human rights proper" for Rawls that justifies his conclusion that states who violate them lose rights to non-intervention by other states, thereby opening the door to the possibility that international corrective action may be justifiable (morally justifiable) in response to violations. Moreover, not only is Rawls's list of human rights not completely given by international law or practice in a conventionalist sense, it is sharply revisionist of the practice (as very many critics, including Gilabert, have pointed out), precisely because it has its own moral logic (45, n42). But even political theorists who look to the practice for justifications of human rights norms have more critical normative resources at their disposal than Gilabert seems to allow. For example, if the processes of international law (including not only the construction of human rights norms and treaties but also their adjudication, as in the European Court of Human Rights) possess normative legitimacy, their outcomes have at least some normative force. The practice may, therefore, contain more normativity on its own terms than Gilabert allows.

As a strategy for addressing entrenched power imbalances that might affect the human rights movement, Gilabert develops a list of "desiderata for the amelioration of human rights practice" (84). The first on this list is "epistemic openness": "We should have a fallibilistic attitude towards the correctness and completeness of the set of human rights we currently accept. We should pay attention to the voice and point of view of people from diverse social settings" (94). This is indeed an important desideratum. And in many respects it seems that Gilabert would agree that it applies to the philosophy as well as the practice of human rights. Many of the processes of international human rights practice (which includes human rights activism, elements of international and domestic politics, and adjudication of human rights norms in international courts, as well as the canonical documents of international human rights law) are much more inclusive of a wide variety of viewpoints than are many philosophical theories of human rights. Taking seriously the desideratum of epistemic openness, this fact would seem to suggest that philosophy may have much to learn from the practice (given its greater inclusiveness). If that's correct, it would be illuminating to see Gilabert engage more extensively with the practice as he further develops the ideas in this book.


I would like to thank Jon Mandle for his helpful comments on a previous draft of this review.

[1] Joseph Raz, 1986. The Morality of Freedom. Oxford: Oxford University Press, Ch. 7.