Human Dignity

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George Kateb, Human Dignity, Harvard University Press, 2011, 238pp., $22.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674048379.

Reviewed by Remy Debes, University of Memphis


You really should read this book. I think …

George Kateb's Human Dignity has the ring of popular philosophy. It isn't rigorously researched, especially with regard to the literature on human dignity. It overreaches, making substantive claims not just about the nature and basis of human dignity, but also human rights, liberty, morality, mind, consciousness, self-consciousness, identity, imagination, language, autonomy, and agency. And it defends more than a few contentious positions, including the central claim that human dignity is underwritten by human uniqueness in the strong sense that humans are partly divorced from the natural order -- a claim, it must be added, which is on the one hand intended secularly and on the other hand defended unabashedly from the armchair. Still -- you should probably read this book.

It is a rewarding book. Rewarding because of its scope -- or more exactly, because of its enviable ability to be (generally) deep despite the incredible scope. Rewarding because of its style -- its intentionally personal tone and scholastically unencumbered pace. And it is rewarding because it is so bold. Given the timid and hedge-prone state of recent work on human dignity, Kateb's confident viewpoint is refreshing and engaging even when it is frustrating, wildly speculative, and wrong. In short, Human Dignity is one of the more interesting contributions on the subject of human worth in the last few decades. It absorbed me when it succeeded. And it absorbed me when it failed.

Ironically, one of this book's more important successes may be one Kateb himself appreciates least: unlike most work on human dignity, Kateb uses the right method. Abstracting from his substantive and normative claims about the nature of dignity, claims which are the focus of the book, Kateb implicitly appears to appreciate the need to get clear on, and be led by, what I have recently called the form of dignity.[1] More exactly, I've argued that the fundamental methodological starting point of any theory of dignity should be to examine the nature of dignity -- not its normative upshot (e.g., what rights or interpersonal claims dignity might ground). That is, we first need a metatheory to tell us what dignity is before we develop a normative theory to tell us what dignity demands. A metatheory of dignity will deliver the form and substance of dignity. It will deliver the properties, distinguishing characteristics, or explanatory demands that apply generally to any contentful account of dignity's nature. And it will deliver all the contentful accounts with those properties. The former establishes the form of dignity; the latter, its substance. In other words, the formal account gives us the necessary and sufficient conditions of any satisfactory account of dignity's nature. The substantive account tells us what that nature actually consists in and is what eventually grounds normative claims in dignity's name.

So now back to Kateb. As I said, his central aim is to articulate a substantive account of human dignity and draw out its normative implications. But his efforts are well balanced. On the one hand, he lets his substantive theory drive his normative claims, which come through the lens of an attending discussion of human rights and through an interesting discussion of what dignity might require of us -- that is, the collective we who claim it, the human species. On the other hand, Kateb's substantive theory is guided by formal theory -- at least implicitly. Thus, although Kateb doesn't abstract out as far as I've suggested we ought to, he does essentially structure the book around a few such formal claims. These claims are all appropriately sketched in the first chapter and then fleshed out (substantively along with their normative implications) in three subsequent chapters.

With respect to the formal sketch in Chapter 1, Kateb first describes the predominant historical and current lay-intuitive purport of "human dignity" as assigning some kind of special value to humans. He writes at the outset,

The core idea of human dignity is that on earth, humanity is the greatest type of beings -- or what we call species because we have learned to see humanity as one species in the animal kingdom, which is made up of many other species along with our own -- and that every member deserves to be treated in a manner consonant with the high worth of the species. (3)

Kateb is roughly correct here. But I think he overestimates the intuition. He treats this general intuition not only as a guide to spelling out more precise formal criteria for human dignity -- which I agree it does -- but also as in itself establishing a criterion of success for any substantive theory -- which I think it does not. Thus, Kateb sets his aim on explicating the superiority of being human, as compared with the less contentious and I think sufficient aim of explicating the distinctiveness of being human. But it would end up self-serving to defend my complaint fully. So, let me simply finish explaining how Kateb develops his own formal account.

Kateb distinguishes two components of the concept of human dignity -- human dignity qua "status" and human dignity qua "stature". With respect to the former, Kateb maintains that all individual human beings have equal value, and a distinctive value at that. With respect to the latter, Kateb maintains that the human species as a whole has a value superior to all other earthly species. He thus sums up, "All individuals are equal; no other species is equal to humanity. These are the two basic propositions that make up the concept of human dignity" (6).

Kateb's next move is perhaps the most crucial. He argues that dignity is an "existential" value, conceptually independent from morality. It is of course closely associated with morality. But it is not a moral value. This opens up a host of obvious questions: Why is dignity existential? Exactly what is existential value? What is its relation to morality? And so on. Kateb recognizes such questions, and the remainder of Chapter 1 and much of Chapter 2 are aimed at answering them. But regardless of his answers, we can appreciate how this "existential" claim itself implies a few further formal features of human dignity.

First, the claim that human dignity is an existential value implicitly suggests something that many, and Kant in particular, have thought crucial to an adequate articulation of the concept of human dignity. Namely, that "dignity" is in some sense incommensurable with all other kinds of value. Kant's strategy was to argue that whatever has dignity is infinitely valuable in virtue of being "raised above all price" (AK 4:434). And as we know, Kant attempted to substantiate the claim that humans (or rationally capable ones anyway) have such dignity by making humanity the grounds of the ultimate principle of morality itself. Humanity thus ends up as the fundamental moral value. Kateb, however, works towards incommensurability by making dignity a different kind of value than moral value, namely, an existential value. Of course, this difference in kind doesn't prove incommensurability, however strongly it implies it.

But now enters the second important formal feature implied by Kateb's "existential" claim: existential value is in turn grounded in a claim about the uniqueness of humans. Kateb claims that, in virtue of a unique set of capacities and qualities, humans partly break from nature -- and in two ways, corresponding to 'status' and 'stature' respectively. On the one hand, each individual human inherently represents the possibility of becoming something radically unlike any other natural creature on earth. On the other hand, the human species, and only the human species, can rise above nature. For, the human species can engage in activities that take nature itself as its object, though this can be destructive or productive. Destruction, Kateb thinks, has been the sad tale of human history. But thankfully the end is not yet written. Unlike any other natural force or entity on earth, humans have the unique opportunity to become nature's steward.

Before I engage either part of this uniqueness claim, notice once again that everything so far really is formal. The claim that "human dignity" has two components, 'status' and 'stature'; the claim that "human dignity" implies value incommensurability; the claim that "human dignity" implies uniqueness: this is all formal theory. In principle, any number of substantive views about human nature might satisfy these conceptual demands. Or, for that matter, we might discover that nothing in human nature satisfies these demands, and the concept of "human dignity" is bankrupt. Kateb of course does try to found the concept of human dignity. But the two discussions -- formal and substantive -- are in principle distinct.

The Uniqueness Claim

Kateb's uniqueness claim is easiest to state in terms of human status. According to him, in virtue of a unique set of mental and psychic capacities and traits, each human person is a pregnant source of boundless potentiality which "empowers" (if that is the right word) a clear and definitive "break" from nature. Humans are natural, but not wholly so. In particular, humans can never be reduced to what is animal. Indeed, Kateb is impatient with reductive naturalist approaches to human nature, and he is happy to fan his Emersonian optimism with introspective and intuitive rejections of the plausibility of any such reduction.

The argument is complex, so I will limit my focus to an embedded argument about the uniqueness of human experience. According to Kateb, every human has an experience imbued with "inwardness." If I follow him, inwardness is identical to, or at least arises out of, "self-knowledge," which is a conceptualization of "what is around one" together with a conception of one's "place in it" (151). Kateb adds to this that "developed" inwardness (and I could not determine whether the qualification of 'developed' is doing any work) "depends on language": "Animals have no language and therefore no inwardness that makes a difference to what they do" (151). Kateb further explains:

If [animals] have, in analogy with human infants, an inwardness that is, in a manner of speaking, made of images and dreams, we have no access to it. Can we even imagine what their images and dreams would be like? Some animals might have emotions, but the risk of anthropomorphizing is present, and what apparent similarities there are do not establish that the word emotion can be used in exactly the same way about animals and human beings, if for no other reason than that animals do not have language and do not have imagination, both of which are interwoven with human emotions. (151)

I have serious reservations about this argument. I grant that what Kateb is claiming corresponds to widespread lay intuitions about human and nonhuman animal thought. And given the somewhat "popular" pitch of the book, I'll allow some latitude for appealing to such intuitions.[2] Still, Kateb oversteps here. Consider: as part of his broader defense of human experiential uniqueness he also defends perspectivism, the idea that each human has a unique interpretation and perception of any non-abstracted object of contemplation (pp. 145-151). Perspectivism thus defines (at least partly) the nature and limits of human perception and thought. In particular, perspectivism denies any direct access to other persons' perspectives. Perspectival experience must somehow be relayed from one person to another, perhaps necessarily supplemented through explicit communication. But if this is right, then doesn't it follow that, even apart from comparisons between human and animal experience, the word "emotion" also can't be used exactly the same between humans? That is, humans also can't perfectly apply the word "emotion" when interpreting the experience of any other human. Even for humans, using that word entails some conceptual slippage. But then noting such slippage in the human-animal case doesn't suffice to undermine appeals to emotion in order to build an animal-human analogy. (And here I'd add that, while there is indeed a constant risk of anthropomorphizing when trying to interpret animals, interpreting other humans is beset by all manner of bias, whether cultural, gendered, racial, class, political, or moral. Now, perhaps to anthropomorphize is to commit a more grievous error of interpretation than failing to bracket or correct such bias. But even if that were true, I wager we need the same cognitive skills to mitigate the one error as we do the other.)

But perhaps Kateb is only insisting that, insofar as we focus on cognitively rich emotions (i.e., those "interwoven" with language and imagination), there is a principled disanalogy between human and animal experience? But then again, the claim that animals lack language and imagination will suffice to irk some readers, who will rightly be dissatisfied with Kateb's mostly armchair insistence on the relevant "facts." Moreover, even putting that issue to one side, Kateb still has a problem. For, if we read him as insisting only on a disanalogy when it comes to cognitively rich emotional experience, then the most we seem to get is an argument for thinking that some range of human affective experience is beyond the capacities of animals. But why think we can dismiss, as relevant to analogizing human and animal experience, whatever range of emotional experience we do share with animals? I don't see that this stronger argument gets made.[3]

Human Stature

I turn now to Kateb's notion of human dignity qua stature. According to Kateb, to realize human dignity fully, we must collectively select an activity that corrects for -- indeed, redeems us from -- the pride and hubris our status-conception of human dignity otherwise tends to engender. Moreover, if Kateb is right, only one activity can meet this demand: the stewardship of nature itself. Thus Kateb writes, the "devotion" to nature that constitutes the activity of stewardship "removes the taint of self-worship from the stature component of human dignity and thus enhances the whole idea of human dignity" (114).

So what is "stewardship"? The aim of stewardship, Kateb explains, is to take on "the impossible task of making nature be to itself" (117). Or, as he says more plainly, to be a steward of nature is to treat nature "as if it deserved to know, if only it could" that it was being served. We must use our (again) unique powers of mind to speak about nature "as if we were speaking to it, as if it became a you to whom we spoke" (117). In short, Kateb is arguing that we -- collectively and singly -- ought to engage in a "second-personal" relationship with nature, in something like Stephen Darwall's sense of that term.[4] Of course, nature is not an actual agent. So is such stewardship just futile ambition? And if so, what reason, backed by what authority, obligates us to a second-personal relationship with nature and all the responsibility that such a relationship implies? Kateb's frank answer might surprise you -- none. Instead, Kateb argues, our reason to become the stewards of nature must be gratitude. "What can I say?" Kateb writes, "To know and admire nature is a form of gratitude for existence, if not for one's own life, then for the rest" (118). And just to be clear, according to Kateb, the object of our gratitude is not Nature (big 'N'), but nature (little 'n'). So what would it mean to be grateful to nature in this sense?

The answer is, despite first appearances, that Kateb doesn't think nature should be the object of our gratitude. Instead, nature is the fitting object of (and perhaps condition of) wonder -- and this wonder is the fitting object of gratitude. Or that is the view as best I can determine it. Frankly, he's rather fast and loose when it comes to explaining the reasons to become nature's steward. Kateb seems to think it rather obvious that we need to, or should want to, justify humanity "itself" -- i.e., that we should want to justify our existence. In turn he thinks it obvious that we need to justify the stature we seem to assume for ourselves. To his thinking, our rapacious historical relationship with nature, and our atrocious historical relationship with one another, should move us to seek such a justification. Otherwise, we don't deserve the "self-divination and self-worship" that the concept of human dignity otherwise implies, let alone all that poetry, disquisition, and homily in its name. Kateb writes,

The idea of human dignity must coexist with the knowledge that human beings have never lived up to their moral and existential standards, whether personal or public, with much consistency, let alone a determination to do so through thick and thin. The works of humanity are better than its days. (119)

Dignity and Morality

Kateb is at his best when he attempts to elucidate the connection between dignity and morality, and, in particular, moral value and existential value (as it relates to dignity). His primary vehicle for this is a discussion of human rights that really should be read by anyone working in the area. But as rich as that discussion is, I want to conclude by considering a more general argument Kateb makes about dignity's relation to morality.

As part of his critique of existing work on human rights, Kateb makes a sustained critique of typical utilitarian concerns with pleasure and happiness. According to Kateb, "the heart of morality is concern for human suffering" (33). But he does not leave it here. He denies, or comes very, very close to denying that pleasure has anything to do with morality. Perhaps most striking is his claim that, "in everyday life, making someone extremely happy does not count morally … however much it counts in the life of the affections, in love and friendship" (83).[5]

Kateb's narrow conception of morality, which puts "the life of affections," "love," and "friendship" outside its purview strikes me as both unintuitive and depressing. Of course, that's not an argument. But thankfully, we don't need more. For, Kateb never really gives an argument for his own view. He makes some good arguments to suggest that pain is more important to morality. For example, he keenly emphasizes a much-neglected comment by Mill in Utilitarianism (Sec. II) that "pain is always heterogenous with pleasure." As Kateb put it, pain and pleasure "are not opposite kinds of sensation but incomparable kinds of experience" (83). Kateb also persuasively highlights uncomfortable implications of centering morality on pleasure, such as R.M. Hare's contention that the Nazi desire to exterminate Jews is wrong only because it must be less intense than the desire of the Jews not to be exterminated (82). Correspondingly, Kateb rejects all flat-footed utilitarian calculations, especially those that might suggest oppressive policies could be justified by the pleasure they bring to the oppressors. This is all well and good. But it doesn't justify the exclusion of pleasure from moral deliberation. Even if pain and pleasure are incomparable, strictly speaking, and flat-footed utilitarian calculations therefore insufficient, this doesn't demonstrate the much stronger claim that pleasure is irrelevant to morality. Thus I reject Kateb's narrow view of morality.

Having said all that, let me turn the discussion constructive by noting a deeply important point about dignity's connection to morality that Kateb ends up getting right. So, even if dignity is not strictly a moral value, I'm certain Kateb would accept that dignity is a part of ethics. This is especially clear when he takes up the specific right to life. He grants that killing is (ceteris paribus) immoral:

But if immorality is the infliction of needless suffering, and death is the end of a person's suffering, isn't there a better way of condemning the taking of human life than calling it immoral? I think we have to say that taking life is not merely immoral but evil. The word immoral is not strong enough to encompass the wrong. (39)

Here Kateb is indirectly confirming that existential harms, and in turn injury to human dignity, constitute definite ethical harms. Indeed, they constitute the gravest kind of ethical harm. In saying so, Kateb makes an important claim I essentially agree with. Namely -- although I don't accept Kateb's narrow conception of morality and I'm happy to call harms to dignity moral harms -- I agree with Kateb that we need special concepts to analyze the nature of harms against human dignity. And I agree that typical moral concepts (and language) do not meet this need.

As I put the point in my own argument, through the example of American chattel slavery:

We bandy about the claim that slavery was an insult to human dignity, but we must realize that if it was, it was not the "mere" denial of rights to some group of people. That is not the relevant sense of "inhumanity" at stake, as if there was simply a problem of discrete (albeit vast in number) moral misjudgments about the value of persons. Slavery was an insult to dignity because it arguably obliterated persons: it erased them from the space of value. This is not only wrong, but vile. Only once we begin to internalize the meaning of this have we made a start.[6]

[1] Remy Debes, "Dignity's Gauntlet," Philosophical Perspectives 23 (1) December 2009: 45-78. (For the record, Kateb's success in this regard is no credit to me. Like most recent work on human dignity, Kateb is -- or was -- unaware of my essay.)

[2] However, if we do allow such latitude, I think we can fairly complain that, even if he ignores the greater part of relevant academic literature, Kateb ought to have at least shown some awareness of other relevant "popular" work on animal minds, like Raimond Gaita's The Philosopher's Dog (Random House, 2004). I'm grateful to Stephan Blatti for bringing this book to my attention and for some other comments on this review.

[3] Yet one more relevant work Kateb seems unaware of is Lynne Rudder Baker's Persons and Bodies: A Constitution View (Cambridge 2000). Unlike Kateb, Baker rests her case for human uniqueness on the claim that humans alone possess the capacity for a strong first-person perspective, but allows that some animals possess a weak first-person perspective

[4] I don't mean to imply it is equivalent. Kateb's conscientious inclusion of an aesthetic component in his argument fits awkwardly with Darwall's own theory. Unfortunately, Kateb seems unaware of the burgeoning work in second-personal ethics. So, we don't have anything definite to help us flesh out the comparison.

[5] In this respect, Kateb's view seems aligned with what Richard Ryder has called "painism." But once again, Kateb unfortunately appears unaware of Ryder's work.

[6] Debes, "Dignity's Gauntlet," p. 55.