Human Enhancement

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Julian Savulescu and Nick Bostrom (eds.), Human Enhancement, Oxford UP, 2009, 423pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199299720.

Reviewed by Robert Streiffer, University of Wisconsin - Madison



The circumstances under which it is ethically permissible to enhance ourselves or our children, and what kind of legal framework should govern such enhancements, is one of the main areas of contemporary bioethics research. Human Enhancement is a revised and expanded collection of articles on these topics, originally presented at a 2004 conference entitled “How Can Human Nature Be Ethically Improved?” The book consists of an introductory overview by Savulescu and Bostrom, ten chapters on the general issue of human enhancement, seven chapters evaluating specific enhancements (two on parental selection of children’s traits, one on prenatal genetic diagnosis and selective abortion in Japan, one on sport, one on longevity, one on cognitive enhancements, and one on “our truth orientation”), and a final chapter on the safety risks posed by attempting to enhance such an incredibly complicated and adapted organism as a human being.

Norman Daniels provides an excellent first chapter, with a careful conceptual analysis of what it means to “modify human nature.” Daniels argues that modifying human nature, as opposed to modifying an individual, would take massive changes at the population level in dispositional traits “thought to be central in explaining human behavior and social structure” (p. 34). But, Daniels concludes, few, if any, proposed enhancements would ever have such grand and far-ranging effects.

Eric Juengst’s chapter targets the proposal by George Annas, Lori Andrews, and Rosario Isasi to implement a world-wide ban on research that would “alter the human species.” The language of the ban invokes images of “the political oppression of minorities, human extinction, and ecological recklessness, private exploitation of public resources, species integrity, the wisdom of nature, and the rights of future generations,” but despite appealing to so many concepts traditionally invoked by the left, Juengst argues that the proposal is essentially based on an illiberal kind of intolerance: “Ultimately, what is at stake in genetic modification is our tolerance for human genetic diversity. Appeals to ‘species integrity’ are about as helpful in that context as appeals to ‘racial purity’ are in designing population genetic research” (p. 49).

Ryuichi Ida addresses the question of improving human nature from an Asian perspective, suggesting that the Western approach is dominated by a utilitarian framework, rejected by Asian cultures. It is true that some prominent bioethicists in the Western tradition are utilitarians. But, rather than saying that the Western approach is predominantly utilitarian, it seems more accurate to say that many non-utilitarian bioethicists are not convinced that individual rights or autonomy provide an adequate basis for restricting many proposed enhancements. This is because they are addressing a future scenario where the safety concerns have been addressed, because they take a particular view regarding the non-identity problem, because they hold minimalist views about the moral status of the early embryo, or because they are restricting their attention to enhancements done with valid informed consent. Combine the absence of rights- or autonomy-based constraints with skepticism about ethical concepts that are not clearly related to individual well-being (as well as skepticism about basing public policy on such concepts), and the results might well take on a utilitarian shape.

The exchange between Michael Sandel and Frances Kamm is one of the book’s highlights. In Sandel’s well-known article, “The Case Against Perfection,” originally published in The Atlantic, he argues that enhancing one’s children extends a disturbing trend of “hyperparenting.” And choosing enhancements for oneself, Sandel says, tends to reduce “a lively sense of the contingency of our gifts — a consciousness that none of us is wholly responsible for his or her success,” and threatens the morally valuable traits of humility, responsibility, and solidarity (pp. 86, 87). The article is already widely used as a classic exposition of the bioconservative position, and deservedly so. It clearly articulates worries often expressed in an inchoate form and relates them to plausible moral values. Frances Kamm’s response, “What Is and Is Not Wrong with Enhancement,” however, is absolutely devastating. Not only does Kamm articulate Sandel’s own arguments far more precisely and clearly than Sandel does himself, but if I am not mistaken, she leaves none of Sandel’s arguments standing at the close of her discussion.

Julian Savulescu provides a helpful introduction to some of the science behind current or proposed enhancements before responding to Bernard Williams’ defense of “the human prejudice.” Savulescu does an impressive job of relating enhancement to the metaethics discussion of reasons for action and value as well as the applied ethics discussion about moral status.

Dan Brock addresses selection of children, carefully canvassing a variety of possible objections, including the expressivist objection to selection, the objection that selection is eugenics, and concerns about risks. Brock, not surprisingly, articulates these concerns with admirable clarity, and concludes that none of them establish that selection itself is morally problematic.

Peter Singer discusses the emergence of a genetic supermarket: a market for genetic enhancements freely and voluntarily selected by parents for their children without government imposition, and then addresses whether government oversight could avoid some of the problems of a genetic marketplace.

Torbjöm Tännsjö addresses medical enhancement in elite sports, distinguishing between negative interventions that are intended to cure a disease or disability, positive interventions that are intended to improve an ability within the normal range of functioning, and enhancement that is intended to improve an ability beyond what is normal for the species. Noting that sports authorities would prohibit a high-jumper who had hired a surgeon to give him three-meter long legs and the use of beta-blockers in shooting, Tännsjö concludes that in elite sports, enhancements are forbidden, and then seeks an explanation of this fact in the ethos of elite sport. He concludes that it is part of the ethos of elite sport that the activity is “a way of exploring the limits of human nature,” a method for finding out “where the limit is for what is possible for a human being to achieve” (p. 324). His use of examples, though, is problematic: the mere fact that some enhancements are ruled out does not mean that all are (the fact that some pole-vault poles are ruled out does not mean that all are), nor does it mean that it is their nature as enhancements that makes them impermissible. Moreover, virtually all elite athletes already have abilities that are beyond what is normal for the species, abilities acquired through intensive training, exercise, and diet. Athletes who disavow enhancements, as Tännsjö defines them, would find themselves quickly run out of the game. Far from being forbidden, enhancements are a de facto requirement. Finally, the examples of enhancements he considers to be ruled out by the ethos of elite sport — beta-blockers shooting and three-meter legs in the high-jump — do not result in capacities that are beyond the limits of human nature or achievements that are beyond the limit of what is possible for a human being: after all, even athletes with beta blockers or three-meter legs are still human beings, and whatever they are able to achieve is eo ipso within the limits of what is possible for a human being to achieve.

Tännsjö also identifies (without endorsing) a conception of justice that he says is peculiar to elite sport, according to which Oscar Pistorius’s prosthetic legs should be prohibited: “we all must accept the ticket we have actually drawn in the genetic lottery.” But it is not plausible to think that the ethos of elite sport distinguishes between an individual who needs prosthetics because of a genetic condition and someone who needed exactly the same prosthetics because of a non-genetic accident, so Tännsjö seems mistaken about the underlying conception of justice.

Christine Overall adeptly addresses longevity-enhancement technologies, arguing that while such technologies might exacerbate existing socioeconomic inequalities, a concern for equality and compensation for past oppression might nonetheless ground a positive obligation to make such technologies readily available to those in traditionally disadvantaged groups.

In “Paternalism in the Age of Cognitive Enhancement,” Dan Wikler extends his classic work on paternalism and the mildly cognitively disabled, exploring the implications of the possibility that some, but not all, people in the future become radically more cognitively sophisticated than we are now, to the point where those not so enhanced may not be smart enough to “navigate the society that the cognitively-enhanced create for themselves” (p. 342). It is a depressing article, concluding that on either a relativistic or a threshold account of intellectual competence, there is no secure foundation for our right to self-determination in such a society, and indeed, our insisting on such a right might well be unfair in the burdens it imposes on the more intelligent.

In the final chapter, “The Wisdom of Nature: An Evolutionary Heuristic for Human Enhancement,” Nick Bostrom and Anders Sandberg take up the practical challenge to safe enhancements posed by the enormous complexity of the human body, coupled with the significant gaps in our understanding of how the body works (as exhibited even in cases of trying to fix a broken body, which one would think would be easier than trying to improve upon a fully functional body). Bostrom and Sandberg say,

Surely it would be foolish, absent strong supporting evidence, to suppose that we are currently likely to be able to do better than evolution, especially when so far we have not even managed to understand the systems that evolution has designed and when our attempts even just to repair what evolution has built so often misfire! (p. 377)

Bostrom and Sandberg identify three circumstances in which this presumption might be rebutted: when the environment for which we were designed by evolution is different from the environment in which we find ourselves, when the functions that evolution has designed us to perform do not align well with the kind of lives that we value, and when a desirable outcome that might have been impossible for evolution to achieve is achievable for us via new kinds of biotechnology. They then carefully explore a litany of useful examples.

Other chapters address general bioconservative objections to enhancement (Caplan, concluding in a mere eight pages that each and every one of them fails); religious and secular interpretations of the idea that enhancements sometimes constitute playing God (Coady, identifying the common concern as the idea that enhancements “may embody unjustified confidence in knowledge, power, and virtue beyond what can reasonably be allowed to human beings” [p. 165]); whether enhancements should be evaluated in terms of equality of opportunity or simply in terms of benefits and harms (Harris, arguing, against Norman Daniels, for the latter); the relationship between enhancement and authenticity (in an excellent chapter by Parens); prenatal genetic diagnosis and selective abortion in Japan (Shimazono, helpfully distinguishing between support for abortion out of concern for women’s rights and out of concern for controlling the population growth rate); and the implications of increasing our orientation towards truth using increased surveillance and documentation, financial markets for idea futures, and imaging devices that would provide for greater mental transparency (Hanson).

The book as a whole strikes a good balance between supporters and critics of enhancement, as well as between works focusing on conceptual clarification, big-picture and long-term considerations, and the detailed examination of particular enhancements. Individually, however, several of the chapters suffer from weaknesses typical in this literature. Those critical of enhancement often make their arguments in broad strokes which seem open to obvious counterexamples without additional clarifications and distinctions. Moreover, even though many of the concerns have a significant empirical element to them, very little empirical evidence is ever adduced.

On the other hand, those supportive of enhancements seem to be downplaying the possible, indeed sometimes likely, negative aspects of enhancements. According to Singer, for example, the objection that enhancements would have a negative effect on equality of opportunity can be answered simply by noting that “we could use our new techniques to provide genetic enhancement for those at the bottom, and restrict enhancement for those at the top” (p. 286). It seems naïve in the extreme to think that such egalitarian measures are feasible in the current political environment. Discussing height enhancement, Sandel responds with similar naïveté to those concerned with the possibility that the rich will be able attain the advantages of increased height while the poor will not. He responds: “we could remedy that unfairness by publicly subsidizing height enhancements” (p. 76).

Moreover, concessions by supporters that enhancements may have negative consequences are too often followed by the response that bad consequences cannot show that enhancement is inherently wrong, as if the actual-but-non-inherent risks are irrelevant to moral evaluation. Dan Brock, for example, responds to the objection that selection of children is wrong because it is eugenics by identifying the problematic features of eugenics and concluding that these features are not intrinsic to selection. But the problematic features of eugenics include a conception of fitness that was influenced by prejudice, a mistaken belief in genetic determinism, the idea that the solutions to social problems were to be found in biology instead of policy reform, and a failure to protect individual interests against unjust encroachment (p. 275). These certainly continue to be problems today, with the potential to affect how selection is used, and so if they made eugenics wrong, why do they not also pose a significant risk of making selection wrong?

Despite these weaknesses, the book as a whole provides an excellent discussion by leading bioethicists of the issues raised by human enhancement. It would be excellent for use in classes devoted to spending at least a few weeks on enhancement, either at the upper-level undergraduate or graduate level.