Human Existence and Transcendence

Placeholder book cover

Jean Wahl, Human Existence and Transcendence, William Hackett (tr. and ed.), University of Notre Dame Press, 2016, 151pp., $40.00 (hbk.), ISBN 9780268101060.

Reviewed by Edward Baring, Drew University


In twentieth-century French intellectual history, Jean Wahl is a ubiquitous if elusive figure. He was the author of the essay and then book, "Vers le concret [towards the concrete]," whose title became a rallying cry for critics of French idealism in the 1930s. Wahl then gained fame for guiding the reception of many of the main non-French sources for existentialism: he wrote the highly respected Études Kierkegaardiennes in 1938, which was an important reference point for scholars both in France and elsewhere, and his readings of Hegel, Heidegger, Nietzsche, and Jaspers set the standard against which a generation of thinkers developed their own interpretations. Later, his books A Short History of Existentialism (1949) and Philosophies of Existence (1959) served as introductions to European thought to students on both sides of the Atlantic. Last but not least, as Samuel Moyn has argued, Wahl's 1937 lecture on transcendence and subjectivity, which serves as the core of the book reviewed here, played a significant role in the development of Emmanuel Levinas's philosophy of the Other.[1]

While recognizing this intellectual significance, we should not fail to note Wahl's prominent institutional position.[2] Aside from his wartime exile in the United States, Wahl was a professor at the Sorbonne from 1936 to his death in 1974, and he became editor of the most important philosophical journal in France, the Revue de métaphysique et de morale in 1950. Wahl also served for many years as president of the Société française de philosophie, and he founded the Collège Philosophique in 1946, which hosted a number of famous debates, including the 1963 lecture in which Derrida exploded onto the French intellectual scene with his searching reading of Foucault's history of madness. Such was Wahl's influence that numerous, now more famous, thinkers like Gilles Deleuze hailed him as one of the most significant and important philosophers in France.[3]

And yet despite this importance, almost all research into Wahl's work has been turned outwards, oriented by the goal of understanding other people. Of the books by Wahl that have been translated into English, of which the most recent appeared only in 1974, the majority are works in the history of philosophy. Moreover, there are very few articles dedicated to Wahl's work itself, even in French, and not a single monograph in English. This is beginning to change. The past two years have seen a resurgence of interest in Wahl as a thinker in his own right. William Hackett's translation of Wahl's Existence humaine et transcendence (1944), under review here, was published in 2016, and Alan Schrift and Ian Alexander Moore's edition of Wahl's most important essays, Transcendence and the Concrete appeared in 2017. In the process of translation, texts are extracted from one context and inserted into another, which is why these new publications allow us to see Wahl, no longer simply as a point of access to an intellectual moment that has now passed, but also as an important contributor to debates that matter today.

If we want to understand Jean Wahl's thinking, Human Existence and Transcendence is a good place to start. The book, according to Hackett, "embodies the thought of Jean Wahl," and it is telling that the 1937 presentation to the Société française de philosophie, which is the book's third chapter and conceptual center, is the most important overlap between the two recent volumes. In addition to the main text, Hackett has included the discussion and correspondence that followed the 1937 lecture, which consists of responses by Gabriel Marcel, Emmanuel Levinas, Martin Heidegger, Karl Löwith, Karl Jaspers, among others. There are few debates in the history of modern European philosophy that could boast so many canonical participants.

As the title indicates, Wahl's book is a meditation on the meaning of transcendence. For Wahl, the word is polyvalent, designating both transcendence-as-end [terme], that which transcends the human, and transcendence-as-movement, the way the human subject reaches beyond itself (26). For Wahl, both aspects are indispensable, and if one is prioritized over the other, transcendence collapses. On the one hand, in traditional religious thinking, transcendence is identified with the divine, in the face of which the human subject and its movement of transcendence are negated (25). On the other hand, transcendence-as-movement cannot survive without transcendence-as-end. For this latter argument, Wahl takes his lead from Kierkegaard, for whom the encounter with divine transcendence institutes a tension at the heart of the subject. According to Kierkegaard, we need an encounter with the "absolute other" in order to disrupt the subject, and elicit the movement of transcendence (31). In fact, Wahl suggests that Heidegger's atheistic ontology can only escape this logic because it harbors the "echo" of religion, heard in the unacknowledged normative shading of his accounts of abandonment and "accursed finitude" (36).

To mediate between these two positions, Wahl elaborates a form of transcendence that escapes our grasp, what he calls a "negative ontology" modeled on "negative theology." But he also radicalizes what he thinks drives Kierkegaard's anxiety: we do not know if we are truly in the presence of God (33). This is why Wahl coined the twin terms "transascendence" and "transdescendence." He suggests that we can never be sure whether the movement of transcendence leads us to gods or to demons, to a higher or a lower plane. Perhaps, he muses, transcendence is simply a facet of nature, which is not exhausted by our intellectual categories and thus can constantly surprise. Moreover, Wahl claims that it is only religious prejudice that leads us to mark one form of transcendence as good and the other as evil (30). Wahl's solution to the antinomy of transcendence, therefore, is to maintain (against Heidegger) the end or goal of transcendence. But, (against traditional religion), he prevents the negation of the self that this stance usually entails by making that end radically indeterminate. He thus institutes a "tension between movement and its end. Neither the end nor the movement should be considered as given, either one by the other, or one without the other" (26).

If understood within his historical context, Wahl's argument reads as an attempt to secularize Kierkegaard's existentialism. Transcendence, Wahl argues, need not reach towards the divine, for the world is also enchanted and full of mysteries. Most proximately, Wahl's argument can be seen as a response to his friend Gabriel Marcel. In 1933, Marcel had written the first essay on Jaspers's existentialism in French. In that essay, Marcel criticized the German thinker for providing a purely "philosophical" account of transcendence. For Marcel, if we extract transcendence from the religious traditions that have embodied it, we rob it of its "vital drive."[4] Wahl sought to contest this argument and make space within existentialism for non-religious thought. He embraced existentialism's account of the real without assuming that this pointed to the existence of God. This is certainly how Marcel understood Wahl's intervention. The longest debate at the 1937 meeting involved Marcel arguing against Wahl that to secularize transcendence was to denature it (98-108).[5]

Wahl's secularizing intent is also readable from his other claims. Take for instance the argument that a secular existentialism runs the risk of being purely abstract, a "general theory of existence," because it tells us that philosophy consists in "a radical option," and yet does "not decide" (37). This argument had first been made in Germany by proponents of Karl Barth's dialectical theology. In the 1933 edition of the dialectical theologians' journal, Zwischen den Zeiten, Erwin Reisner had argued that "to reflect on existence means after all to conduct oneself in an un-existential manner";[6] the lesson one should learn from the philosophy of existence was that we had to take a leap of faith and choose God.[7] Wahl, however, draws a different conclusion from this argument. He holds up as an exemplar not simply the saint, but also the artist. He claims that figures like "Rimbaud, Van Gogh, and Nietzsche" (the latter being what Wahl called a "poet-thinker" (3)) brought us closer to existence than the philosophers of existence (37-8). Not only did poets and artists respond practically rather than theoretically to the dilemmas of existence, but they were also able to hold the two contradictory elements of transcendence together, without reducing one to the other (72). Most importantly they could reveal the ineffable in the smallest parts of the universe, not simply in a God that existed beyond it: as Wahl wrote, "the poet will make us feel that the physical is the metaphysical and that which passes by is eternal" (75).

In his rich and thought-provoking introduction, Hackett pushes back against this interpretation of Wahl's thought, nudging him from the secular and into the religious camp. Hackett relies on the fact that Wahl's account of metaphysical experience keeps open the possibility of religious faith, and suggests that the latter might even be the paradigmatic example of transcendence for Wahl (xxx, xxxix-xl). In making these claims, Hackett discusses Wahl's personal beliefs, digging up some fascinating clues about his conflicting relationship to religion; Wahl hovered between faith and unbelief, Catholicism and Judaism (xxxi-xxxiii). But Hackett's most forceful arguments come from shifting his interpretative frame. Rather than reading Wahl in relation to those thinkers to whom he responded, Hackett looks forward to those thinkers Wahl foreshadowed. This is philosophical analysis in the anticipatory mode.[8] For Hackett, Wahl's 1944 book is representative of the philosophical era that followed it, from 1945 until 1968 (xvii). Most importantly, Hackett thinks that Wahl's argument prefigures the so-called "theological turn in phenomenology" from the 1980s and 90s, and especially the work of Jean-Luc Marion.

Hackett takes his cue here from Wahl's exchange with Levinas. In response to Wahl's 1937 lecture, Levinas had written a letter criticizing Wahl's reading of Heidegger. For Levinas, the debate over whether transcendence required an end depended upon an "ontic" reading of Heidegger's thought, that is, one that presented his work as an analysis of entities. And yet this is what Heidegger had denied; for him, transcendence was ontological, allowing Dasein to move from an entity to its Being, from a chair to what a chair is. The ontological understanding of transcendence, for Heidegger, preceded and was indifferent to the ambiguity between transascendence and transdescendence, or between a religious and a secular transcendence (119-21). Wahl responded by arguing that Heidegger's ontology was always informed by the ontic, and thus that the indeterminacy of transascendence/ transdescendence was at work even there (122).

Wahl's argument here does not need to imply the priority of religious transcendence. We find a secularizing version in an essay by Karl Löwith from 1930, a position which he repeated in the 1937 debate (134). Löwith claimed that Heidegger's atheistic ontology aligned with dialectical theology because it retained the traces of Kierkegaard's theological and thus ontic investigations.[9] But for Löwith, this compatibility did not prove that Heidegger's thought was nourished by theological sources; rather it was evidence that dialectical theology was complicit in its own secularization. In seeking to free the divine from any human contamination, the dialectical theologians had also purged the world of all divine traces.

For Hackett, in contrast, this reading of Heidegger aligns Wahl with Marion. Wahl's metaphysical experience of transcendence is perhaps akin to Marion's "saturated phenomenon," where what is given overflows the intentional act with which we grasp it. According to this argument, both thinkers held that religious revelation informs secular ideas about rationality, a process Hackett calls the "transfer of intelligibility" (xxiii-xxiv). Wahl's rejection of Heidegger's purely immanent transcendence-as-movement, and thus maintenance of transcendence-as-end, however indeterminate, shows that he holds open the possibility that religious experience could be paradigmatic for human reason, both challenging and informing it (xxxviii-xxxix).

The divergence between these two readings of Wahl's work, one from the perspective of the first half of the twentieth century and the other from the perspective of the second, presents a challenge to Hackett's "transfer of intelligibility" argument. For, rather than showing that an experience we can clearly define as "religious" nourishes one that we can clearly define as "secular," it suggests that those labels are historically contingent. Religious and secular discourse can inform one another, but only because no experience can be defined as religious or secular once and for all. But we can also look at the divergence in another way: as testament to the value and continued importance of Wahl's thought. For it is the sign of an original thinker that his or her writing can detach itself from the moment of its production and gain different and surprising meanings when deployed in new debates. And this is why we should be grateful that, with this translation, Wahl is no longer a half-forgotten figure from the past, but is available to new generations of readers to inspire and provoke.

[1] Samuel Moyn, Origins of the Other (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 2005), 177-86.

[2] For a succinct and helpful account of Wahl's life and career, see Hackett's introduction. xix-xxi.

[3] For a compact analysis of his influence see the introduction to Jean Wahl, Transcendence and the Concrete: Selected Writings, Alan D. Schrift and Ian Alexander Moore (eds.), (New York: Fordham University Press, 2017), 10-20.

[4] Marcel, "Situation fondamentale et situations limites chez Karl Jaspers," in Recherches Philosophiques II, (1932-3) 346-8.

[5] Wahl in contrast argues that he wanted to argue for something more "primitive" than the idea of God. See also Wahl's skepticism about Marcel's account of prayer, in Wahl, "Vers le concret" Recherches Philosophiques I, (1931-2), 10.

[6] Reisner, "Existenzphilosophie und existentielle Philosophie," Zwischen den Zeiten 11, (1933), 61

[7] Reisner, "Existenzphilosophie und existentielle Philosophie," 58 and 78.

[8] See Hackett, xxxviii (anticipating "transgressive realism"), xxxix (anticipating theological turn), xlii (anticipating Derrida's différance).

[9] See Karl Löwith, "Phänomenologische Ontologie und protestantische Theologie," Zeitschrift für Theologie und Kirche 38, (1930).