Human Goodness: Pragmatic Variations on Platonic Themes

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Paul Schollmeier, Human Goodness: Pragmatic Variations on Platonic Themes, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 302pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521863848.

Reviewed by Alan Pichanick, St. John's College, Annapolis


Paul Schollmeier's Human Goodness is an expansive work that proposes "to take a concept of happiness gleaned from the ancients and to see what the consequences might be if we were to take it seriously as a principle of moral philosophy" (xi). And the provocative theme that pervades the book is what Schollmeier calls an "ephemeral teleology": he hopes to "take the ancient concept of teleology and make use of it as if it were of variable forms" (xii). This ephemeral teleology will rescue us from problems in our contemporary moral discourse that stem from ways of thinking borrowed from Hume and Kant. (However, Schollmeier's own views do echo or even borrow vital, non-detrimental elements of Humean and Kantian analysis.) From the pragmatists Schollmeier takes the "experimental method" (xiii). But Schollmeier will not accept, I think rightly, the conception of happiness -- as "desire satisfaction" -- that James offers, which does injustice to the ancient one he puts forth.

The first three chapters develop three ideas that most clearly show Schollmeier's understanding of human goodness, and his "pragmatic variations". The first chapter focuses on theoretical reason and introduces the claim that underlies most, if not all, of his "experiment". Schollmeier concludes, after a detailed discussion of the divided line in the Republic, that all knowledge is "hypothetical knowledge" (6) for we do not grasp any first principles, nor can we (especially not the ultimate form of the good (10)). Schollmeier then is no Platonist, if that means that one believes that we need dialectic to transcend our opinions and hypotheses to ascend toward unhypothetical first principles. Rather, the realm of opinion is where we always are. Schollmeier even advocates "philodoxy as love of opinion". True philosophers love opinion, but see that it is contingent (66). Just how exactly is this done? The Platonic concept of opinion and the Jamesian concept of knowledge turn out to be similar. And thus we have "an initial pragmatic variation on a Platonic theme" (18). This is connected to the new image of Socrates as "pragmatic daimon", who "can only rest on the empirical principles of association. These principles enable us to establish true opinion about our own being, which is a contingent affair. We might say that our philosophy is not idealistic but doxastic. Or, perhaps, pragmatic." In short, one could say that Socratic knowledge is human, all too human, even the erotic Socrates of the Symposium (76-77).

Chapter 2 picks up on this theme, exploring "The Method in Question". Now, "the experimental method is essentially the same as rhetorical argument by example" (33). The techniques "proceed from particulars through generalities to other particulars and they concern objects that are contingent" (ibid.). Dialectic has been replaced with a method that does not discover eternal truths but still provides an objective foundation for ethics. This is the second idea that drives Schollmeier's thinking. The problem now: it is much harder to get clear about the idea's details.

Schollmeier aims to "draw you away in your practical concerns from any concern with eternal truth to a concern with temporal truth" (37). There is good reason for this: actions are for the "somewhere and somewhen." And it is only rhetoric that can give us these temporal truths. We must beware of bad rhetoric, and Schollmeier carefully examines the discussion in the Gorgias in this regard, but if we consider Aristotle's account of rhetoric, we "can already see … that a rhetorical art can be objective if it rests on arguments, inductive and deductive, concerned with objects of change" (43). This is mainly done with three examples: history, fable, and parable (58-59). But here is where the analysis falls short. What makes these different methods persuasive? Why do they have a claim on me? What exactly is their efficacy (psychological or otherwise)? It seems that Schollmeier gives us a tool without explaining explicitly enough how the tool is working. Examples of rhetoric in action are few, and not fully explored. If Schollmeier is right, then our education to virtue takes place (entirely?) by rhetorical example. More needs to be said about why. Perhaps this fits with the presentation of myth in Plato's Republic and the turn to habituation in the Nicomachean Ethics (a book Schollmeier could have used more here -- how on his account does he make sense of the text as a whole? Does the turn to contemplation fit with his emphasis on rhetoric and the experimental method? If not, should it be jettisoned?). Perhaps we do not need the psychological theory behind the view of soul formation that Schollmeier is putting forward here. But then I fear that we don't really recognize that our dreams are merely dreams as Schollmeier wants (67). We would continue to be dreaming without knowing it. In fact, Plato's Socrates is quite concerned with this in discussing the difference between knowledge and opinion in the Republic. Schollmeier has taken unhypothetical knowledge away from us, so it is very difficult to see how we can judge between our opinions (or dreams) from within the shadowy realm we now inhabit. It may be possible to do so, and rhetoric is supposedly the solution, but how it solves this problem is still unclear to me.

All this is preliminary, for in Chapter 3 Schollmeier defines happiness itself. The hypothesis arrived at, via intriguing discussions of the ladder of love in the Symposium and a careful account of justice in Book 4 of the Republic, is that we are happy "when our intellectual and emotional powers function together in an organic unity … (81). We must also possess material resources (82), and Schollmeier quickly reminds us how context-dependent this definition is: what we should do always depends on both internal and external circumstances (83). Yet happiness is now valued for its own sake for it "rests on the natural functions of the soul" (88).

At this point Schollmeier asks how well this Greek concept compares to the American notion of happiness, since, for James, the good is essentially desire satisfaction (92-93). Answer:  Socrates must have the upper hand, for his view of happiness emphasizes our nature as "rational animals" (102) and "our reason can determine better than our passion the very hypotheses that we ought to entertain about our own soul or any other entity" (ibid.). Schollmeier may be right about this. But what would it take to justify this claim? One who disagrees with this "hypothesis" won't be surprised when the consequences aren't to his liking. For if we give Schollmeier this, then he can take it a long way. Our rational nature precludes us from seeing Hume's sympathy as a viable foundation for ethical action (108). And on this score, Schollmeier is closer to Kantians who see rationality intrinsically tied to human nature as an end in itself. But he disagrees with those Kantians who, like James, see happiness as mere "desire satisfaction" (108). And more importantly, the proper path "is that one may engage in a rational activity for its own sake without pretending to a rationality presumed to be absolute" (109).  Keep in mind that the rationality we now aspire to can't be one where we seek knowledge of eternal forms. It is in this way that Schollmeier wants to both recover the ancient wisdom and escape the argument between Hume and Kant.

With that framework in mind, the next three chapters tackle Freedom (Chapter 4), Imperatives (Chapter 5), and Cosmology (Chapter 6). Following upon his earlier claims,  Schollmeier now argues that "we are permitted to aspire to a freedom that cannot be at all absolute but can be at best be only relative" (114), that all "moral necessity is hypothetical" (159), and that the universe itself is "absurd" for it is an "organized accident" (193), which is both teleological and contingent (207).

True freedom "would be the power to engage in a rational activity for its own sake, undertaking said activity with full knowledge of ourselves and our circumstances and without hindrance from any internal or external constraints. But we are not allotted full knowledge of ourselves or anything else" (133). Schollmeier quickly admits that there will be a problem here: his view of freedom launches Kant's antinomy of practical reason. "We as things in themselves are free from the necessity of nature, but as things in appearance we are enmeshed in natural causality … But we cannot avail ourselves of this distinction … I have denied us any knowledge of things as they might be in themselves" (141). Here Schollmeier turns to Aristotle and says that it is our rationality itself, which is a natural internal cause, which saves us from this paradox (142-143). Schollmeier is on an interesting track here, and one would surely like to hear more about why the Aristotelian notion of reason need not lend itself to a bifurcated world of noumena and phenomena like Kant's view does.

In turning to imperatives, Schollmeier argues that Kant is right that rationality is an end in itself, but that its function is not chiefly self-legislation, but perhaps the attainment of happiness (as the "ancients" understood it) (154). For Schollmeier, "any necessity in our endeavors depends upon what we believe to be our end … But we determine what our end is by hypothesis only" (164). Once again we have moved from the absolute, universal to the temporal, contingent. If Schollmeier is given the claims about knowledge in his first chapter, his assertions here are tempting, especially when coupled with his incisive critique of Kant's admitted inability to explain how reason, by itself, can motivate an action (190). A better "hypothesis" does seem to be given by Socrates: the motivation of acting for the sake of a well-ordered soul (166).

It is appropriate that in discussing cosmology Schollmeier is interested in the strange part-whole relationship that we have to the universe. His position is that we cannot deny that the universe is "an efficient and a final cause of motion" and thus is "alive or, at least, lifelike" (196). The universe is its own end, and "we are part and parcel of it" (225). Yet the problem, he again raises, after an illuminating discussion of these controversial issues (in which he is indebted to Kant and Aristotle, even though they must again be tempered with contingency), is that we cannot know this, and must remain skeptics (235). Rhetoric and myth being our only options, we should strive to be not philosopher-kings but philodoxer-kings (235-236).

On that note, we return to "Human Virtue" in the penultimate chapter of the book. It focuses most directly on Platonic psychology and self-knowledge, and in my view, it is this chapter that gives the most interesting and illuminating analysis so far, and even makes at least some headway in addressing the serious concerns left over from the first three chapters. He begins by stating that "the human predicament" is complicated by numerous, objective, hypothetical moral principles that are constantly subject to change (238-239). As a guide through this predicament, he thus turns to the notion of love (eros) and the image of the tripartite soul described in the Phaedrus. The erotic image turns out to illustrate the message of temperance of the Delphic Oracle: "we may with our knowledge rein in a wayward emotion that might otherwise lead us to an unseemly erotic extreme. Our intellect would appear to have the power both to know the truth and to control our passions" (242). It is the attainment of rationality that leads us to happiness, when our knowledge informs our passions (247). This fits in with an ascent up the divided line in Book 6 of Plato's Republic, where we reach "absolute, sublime truth above the heavens" (245).

Don't think that Schollmeier has withdrawn everything said about knowledge and contingency, for he quickly adds that our advance up the divided line involves moving "from lesser moral hypotheses to grander moral hypotheses" and "that we might better use rhetoric to find our way through the heavens only" (245). Now he gives us such an instance in turning to Aristotle's doctrine of the mean. The mean by its very nature, both Aristotle and Schollmeier tell us, is relative to us. What is healthy for Napoleon will be different from what is healthy for me. And in just one person, our moral principles are changing, so we must use "an argument by example" in order to determine a mean for ourselves. "As our past self is to our present self, so ought our past action to be to our present action" (262).  If I'm following, Schollmeier is trying to bring to light what is unchanging amidst the flux of the realm of action so that we can actually have a continuous self capable of some approximation of virtue. But the only candidate he sees for this unchanging-ness is in the realm of "analogy between perceptible entities" that falls under the category of rhetoric or argument by example. What is still unclear to me is how exactly this works, and why this need be the case. For I am still unsure how stable Schollmeier's own epistemological position can be. If indeed his skeptical claim is true, that all knowledge is hypothetical and some hypotheses are just better rhetorically than others, how should we evaluate his own skeptical claim? How also should we evaluate the appeals he has made to Aristotle's doctrine of the mean and Socrates' account of love (eros)? Are these merely contingent hypotheses themselves, to be overturned when something rhetorically superior comes along? Or has he appealed to them for some other reason?

I think Schollmeier is at his best when he is engaged with texts seriously, probing them with his agile mind and astute questions. As I said above, the penultimate chapter is extremely well done in this regard, and throughout, his textual exegesis is a pleasure to read. But it is harder to get a hold when he leaves that task for the larger thesis he is trying to pull together. Perhaps it is for this reason that I find the final chapter of the book disappointing. It is titled "A Symposium" and schematized as a presentation of "Poetical Reason", so perhaps we should take it as argument by example, or rhetoric, now in action. The chapter presents a dialogue between Schollmeier and a colleague. It is an opportunity for Schollmeier to re-present, in this medium, the major issues of the book, and to allow the wit of his voice to shine unimpeded. (As a writer, Schollmeier has a casual, conversational tone that is unique.) Other readers may feel differently, but unfortunately I did not come away with a better understanding of the themes of the work from this dialogue. Nor did I get an insight into why dialogue itself (or, again, rhetoric) would be the right medium to explain these themes. And this is what makes the dialogues of Plato infinitely fascinating, of course. But Schollmeier has, if nothing else, reminded us how infinitely fascinating and important the Platonic conception of happiness is.