Human Identity and Bioethics

Placeholder book cover

David DeGrazia, Human Identity and Bioethics, Cambridge, 2005, 300pp., $25.99 (pbk), ISBN 052153268X.

Reviewed by Jennifer Hawkins, University of Toronto


David DeGrazia's Human Identity and Bioethics is an important and interesting book. DeGrazia investigates the links between philosophical concerns about our identity and various pressing practical issues in bioethics -- including the definition of death, the authority of advance directives, the moral permissibility of enhancements, and the moral permissibility of abortion. The book is well-written and clear and should be of interest to a diverse group of theorists.

DeGrazia first develops a philosophical account of numerical identity: an account of the persistence conditions of beings like us. Emphasizing the important link between discussions of numerical identity and essence, he argues that we are essentially human animals (as opposed to persons or embodied minds) and that our persistence conditions are those of the human organism. Historically, the most powerful forms of resistance to such a view of what we are have come from those who think that it does not do enough to capture what we care about in ourselves. However, one of DeGrazia's aims is to convince us that we need to separate metaphysical questions about essence and persistence from questions about self-concern and what we care about in survival. His second project is therefore to develop an account of what he calls "narrative identity." Unlike a theory of persistence conditions, this is intended to be an account of the concerns we have when we identify with ourselves over time in an evaluative sense. One of the central themes of DeGrazia's book is that failure to adequately distinguish questions about numerical identity from questions about narrative identity has led to much confusion in bioethics.

The book opens with an admirably clear summary of recent work on personal identity. DeGrazia frames the debate as one between three major possibilities: (1) the biological view he defends (while also acknowledging a debt to Eric Olson's earlier defense, in The Human Animal [1997]); (2) Jeff McMahan's embodied mind account, according to which we are essentially brains with the functional capacity to support consciousness (defended in The Ethics of Killing [2002]); and (3) a view DeGrazia labels "personalism." Personalism refers to any theory that combines psychological criteria for identity over time with the claim that beings like us are essentially persons. 'Person' in this context refers to beings with the current capacity (as opposed to the mere potential) for complex forms of conscious mental life. Although both the embodied mind account and personalism come in for attack, there is a significant difference in the way the two are treated. DeGrazia clearly takes the embodied mind account to be much more promising than any form of personalism. Hence, although its primary aim is to argue for the superiority of the biological account, the chapter's secondary aim is to argue that personalism (but not the embodied mind account) falls below some acceptable threshold of metaphysical plausibility. As we shall see, this becomes important later when he turns to practical topics.

After defending the biological account of numerical identity and essence, DeGrazia turns to consider narrative identity -- his phrase for that which underwrites self-concern. While numerical identity is, of course, necessary for self-concern, it is not sufficient. Nor, DeGrazia argues, is mere continuing consciousness or continuing consciousness plus lack of future suffering sufficient. What underwrites my concern about the future life of X (with whom I am numerically identical) is that X is living out a later stage of the same narrative that is my personal narrative. X is continuing the story that is my story. As DeGrazia envisions it, narrative identity is fairly open and fluid. My life story need not have any particular narrative structure to count as a story. Whatever has in fact happened to the distinct human animal that I am forms a part of my narrative identity, as do facts about how I perceive myself and what I value. Narrative identity in this minimal sense comes much closer to capturing what we care about in existence; and for many people, it is sufficient to capture what underlies self-concern. However, DeGrazia also recognizes that for some people it is particularly important to be active "writers" of their own narrative. Admittedly, not all people are in a position to assume an active role, and not all of those in a position to do so wish to. But for those who do, self-creation, which DeGrazia defines as "the autonomous writing of self-narratives," is an additional significant part of what matters in survival. If I value self-creation, then I may also value the future life of X because that life is one that I am, even now, in the process of composing or crafting. I care about that life because that life (good or bad) will be (at least partly) the outcome of my current creative efforts.

Having developed accounts of both numerical identity and narrative identity, DeGrazia turns to consider a number of important topics in bioethics. He begins with the definition of death. Contrary to contemporary orthodoxy, DeGrazia defends a circulatory-respiratory definition of death -- death as the permanent cessation of circulatory-respiratory function. He also argues convincingly against both the philosophically popular "higher brain" definition and the even more widely accepted "whole-brain" definition. The argument against the whole brain view is simply that it fails to live up to its biological ambitions. The most influential rationale developed thus far for the whole brain account argues that (1) death is best understood in biological terms as the loss of integrated functioning of the organism as a whole and (2) that the whole brain (or at least the brain stem) is necessary for such integrated functioning. Yet considerable empirical evidence amassed in recent years suggests that (2) is false. The brain may "augment or refine" the functioning of the organism, but it is not necessary for such functioning.

Issues related to identity enter when we turn to consider the arguments against "higher-brain" definitions of death. DeGrazia begins by distinguishing metaphysical arguments from evaluative ones. Only those theorists who reject the idea that we are essentially human animals (as DeGrazia does not) will be tempted by the metaphysical defense of a "higher-brain" account. But, as DeGrazia points out, both of the popular alternative theories of our essence -- personalism or the embodied mind account -- have metaphysically implausible implications when used to defend a higher-brain account of death. (Of course, it is possible to accept one of these views of our essence and not employ it to defend this definition of death.) Arguments for higher-brain death which appeal to these views of our essence must either fly in the face of our ordinary concept of death (for example, by insisting that a fully integrated, independently breathing organism is nonetheless dead -- think here of certain PVS patients) or they must say that there are really two deaths associated with each human animal. In a PVS case, there is first the death of a being of our kind, and only later the death of a human organism. Neither view is terribly plausible, metaphysically. (Moreover, those who adopt the second strategy must still explain why we need not be concerned about the life of the human animal, once the person has "died.") A seemingly much more plausible way to approach the defense of a higher brain definition of death is to offer an explicitly evaluative argument -- one that provides evaluative reasons for revising our ordinary concept of death. What we care about in life (so the argument might go) is continued existence as a person or at least as a sentient being. Once the capacities that support personhood or sentience are lost, we should, for practical reasons, consider the remaining human organism as dead (despite the fact that it is biologically alive). However, DeGrazia maintains that once the argument is presented in explicitly evaluative terms, it becomes clear that it will not capture the self-concerns of all individuals. There clearly are some people who prospectively identify (in the narrative sense) with later phases of themselves when they will have lost personhood and perhaps even sentience. Such an individual identifies with these later stages of himself in the sense that he deeply believes that he will be that individual and that what happens to that individual will be part of his personal life narrative. While such attitudes may not be common, they are not, DeGrazia argues, incoherent. Hence, attention to narrative identity and self-concern does not vindicate the higher brain definition. At best, it suggests that some individuals be allowed to adopt the higher brain criteria for themselves.

DeGrazia next considers questions about the authority of advance directives. Suppose I am diagnosed with Alzheimer's disease and that, while still healthy and of sound mind, I autonomously decide (and communicate in writing) that I do not wish to receive even simple forms of life-saving care once I enter the advanced stages of the disease. A practical question arises about how much authority this preference of mine has -- particularly given that, by the time it becomes relevant, the individual to be affected will be so dramatically different from the individual who made the request. Although the mainstream view is that advance directives have significant authority, a considerable number of theorists have questioned the coherence of this position by appealing to concerns about identity. If the individual who writes the directive is not, strictly speaking, the same individual whose care is later in question, then the authority of the directive vanishes. For while one presumably has authority to make decisions about one's own life, this authority does not extend to making decisions that affect other individuals. This is known in the literature as "The Someone Else Problem." However, DeGrazia convincingly argues that such worries cannot even get off the ground unless we adopt some variant of personalism. The argument assumes that we are essentially persons, and that once the capacity for higher forms of consciousness has been lost, the person who wrote the directive no longer exists (even though a numerically distinct human animal may exist). But if personalism is as metaphysically flawed as DeGrazia claims, then we should resist the temptation to see a problem here. Without denying that progressive dementia radically alters the features of an individual, he argues that we should view the pre-dementia individual and the demented individual as a single being -- a human animal -- that has persisted through radical change. Once again, issues of self-concern appear to have colored the metaphysical landscape. Clearly, many people have a hard time identifying (now in the narrative sense) with a future self that is so mentally deficient. But this alone is not evidence for the existence of two distinct beings.

In chapter 6, DeGrazia considers debates about the permissibility of enhancements, i.e. changes intended to improve human form or function beyond what is necessary for restoring health or maintaining species typical functioning. In particular, DeGrazia focuses on three controversial forms of enhancement: cosmetic surgery, cosmetic psychopharmacology and (potential future) genetic enhancements. Despite the fact that some bioethicists have made much of the idea that alterations of key qualities of an individual might be identity-altering and so morally suspect, DeGrazia plausibly points out that most such claims rely on a confusion between numerical and narrative identity. Some theorists avoid this confusion by claiming instead that significant changes of narrative identity may be inauthentic or represent attempts to change inviolable core characteristics, and so are morally suspect for these reasons. However, DeGrazia plausibly dismantles these arguments.

In Chapter 7, he considers whether prenatal genetic interventions (either prenatal genetic therapies or prenatal genetic enhancements) are identity-affecting, and if so, how this affects their ethical permissibility. Further refining his biological account of our essence -- to argue that we come into being only once we are uniquely individuated (once twinning and fusion are no longer possible) -- DeGrazia argues that only those prenatal genetic interventions performed on a pre-individuation zygote are identity-affecting. Moreover, although such interventions do affect which individual will come into existence, they are not morally problematic because they do not put a being of our kind out of existence. On the other hand, those prenatal genetic interventions that are performed on a post-individuation fetus are not identity-affecting even if they create radical changes in the individual. Hence, identity concerns do not really create moral problems here. In each case, moral permissibility turns on other issues, such as safety, the benefits of the intervention, and the general permissibility of enhancements.

Finally, DeGrazia considers the ethics of abortion. This is a natural topic for him to explore, given that his own biological account of our essence might seem to imply the impermissibility of early abortion. Unlike personalism (which denies that a fetus is one of us) and the embodied mind account (which denies that a pre-sentient fetus is one of us), the biological view insists that we were all once fetuses. Using Jeff McMahan's concept of time-relative interests, DeGrazia nonetheless defends the moral permissibility of early abortion. On his view, the early fetus is so psychologically discontinuous with its future self that its interest in becoming that future self is radically diminished. Death -- which in this case eliminates a future, but one in which the fetus is only minimally invested -- is therefore not nearly as much of a harm for the fetus as death would be for you or me.

In general, I find DeGrazia's book both impressive and persuasive. However, I can anticipate a few places where it will come in for criticism. One flaw of the presentation is in chapter two's treatment of personalism. As mentioned before, DeGrazia seems almost as interested in getting readers to reject any form of personalism as he is in getting them to accept the biological view. In a number of places, he suggests that personalism is significantly less plausible than either the biological view or the embodied mind account. However, I think this conclusion could be challenged. The main problems that traditional forms of personalism have faced concern the articulation of the relationship between persons and human animals. DeGrazia considers in some detail the personalist theory developed by Lynn Rudder Baker in Persons and Bodies (2000), and he acknowledges that her constitution account of the relationship between persons and animals (i.e. that persons are constituted by human animals, much as a statue is constituted by the bronze) goes a long way towards solving these traditional problems. However, he rejects Baker's view for three reasons. First, since a newborn lacks the current capacity for higher forms of consciousness, and since we are essentially persons, it implies that none of us was ever born. It also implies that, strictly speaking, we are not animals. Third, and perhaps most importantly, DeGrazia finds fault with Baker's rather mysterious account of personal identity over time, which relies on an unanalyzed notion of a "first person perspective." For all of these reasons, DeGrazia rejects Baker's version of personalism, and personalism more generally.

However, those sympathetic to some version of personalism will think that this argument goes too fast. It seems possible to imagine a version of personalism that retains Baker's analysis of the person/animal relationship in terms of constitution, but which abandons her mysterious account of identity over time. Such a view would then avoid the more serious traditional objections and would really only have two remaining problems: the newborn problem and the "we are not animals" problem. Just how bad these remaining problems are may be a matter of variable philosophical intuition. But it is worth noting that DeGrazia thinks that, in the end, the embodied mind account is similarly left with two problems. One is actually the same problem as one of personalism's: namely, both views imply that, strictly speaking, we are not animals. The second problem for the embodied mind account arises when a theorist tries to specify the exact relationship between the mind and the brain. All of the possibilities -- for example, mind-brain identity -- produce strange results. But is the claim that none of us were ever born (admittedly, an embarrassment for personalism) so much worse than the claim (which follows from mind-brain identity plus mind essentialism) that you and I actually weigh less than ten pounds and are both prematurely grey and wrinkled? DeGrazia's claim that the embodied mind account is so much more plausible than any version of personalism seems inadequately defended.

As things stand, I am inclined to accept the biological view DeGrazia endorses. As a result, I am inclined to accept much of what he has to say in the practical realm as well. However, inasmuch as his practical discussions partly aim to convince people to give up on theses in bioethics that depend on personalism in one way or another, it is possible that not everyone will be convinced. Still, DeGrazia has powerfully called into question much that is current orthodoxy in bioethics, and so theorists of all persuasions interested in these topics are well advised to read this book.