Human Interests: or Ethics for Physicalists

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Joseph Mendola, Human Interests: or Ethics for Physicalists, Oxford University Press, 2014, 412pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199682829.

Reviewed by Bekka Williams, University of Arkansas


Joseph Mendola's overall project in is the defense of a novel ethical theory that is consistent with physicalism yet delivers justificatory force approximating that claimed by non-naturalist ethical theories. This theory, which Mendola calls Material Morality (MM) is primarily act-consequentialist, but he argues that the view is also able to accommodate widespread intuitive elements of both deontology and virtue ethics. After defending MM, Mendola concludes by giving specific recommendations for how citizens of relatively well-off countries ought to act -- and must act, if they are to avoid serious immorality according to MM.

Mendola's arguments for MM span an impressive range of topics in value theory (very possibly the most inclusive I have seen in a single book of this length). Mendola argues not only for a new version of act consequentialism, but also for a "simple" desire account of individual good and a method for adjudicating conflicts of individual good, which makes central appeal to group action.

Mendola does not argue for physicalism in this book. Rather, he takes physicalism as a starting point and argues that his view comes as close to robust normativity as is possible given physicalism. In Part I, Mendola defends a conditional account of options, which makes central appeal to trying (80). Part I also involves a detailed discussion of indeterminacy, which informs Part II's arguments for his simple desire account of human well-being.

In Part II, Mendola defends MM and argues that it can provide moral reasons for all rational agents without appealing to non-natural goodness or rightness. MM has two parts -- a simple-desire-based account of individual good and a method for determining what agents ought to do in cases of conflict between the individual good of different agents (or between the same agent at different times).

Mendola's defense of his desire-based view of individual good involves a survey of the alternatives (objectivist views and varieties of hedonism), after which he argues of each that it either is inconsistent with physicalism or collapses into a desire-based view. Thus, Mendola concludes, desire-based views are the only plausible options. Finally, he argues that the indeterminacies he illustrated in Part I plague ideal-desire accounts to such an extent as to render them unworkable, leaving simple desire accounts the only plausible option.

In chapter 7, Mendola gives positive arguments for his account of individual well-being and claims that it underwrites "one form of normatively relevant good that bridges all individuals . . . that we can compare across all such individuals and also across the moments of anyone's life" (198). Mendola also defends the view that the relevant comparisons are between individuals at a time ("atomic agents"), on the grounds that human good is grounded in preferences, and these can (and often do) change over time.[1]

Mendola argues that his desire-based account of individual good can be extended to identify an interpersonal good that is comparable across agents by appeal to what he calls "consensus congruence." There is consensus congruence between agents regarding a preference roughly when those agents share the preference (191-92). Most importantly for MM, Mendola claims that there are some preferences that are shared by all or nearly all normal adult human atomic agents. This consensus congruence, Mendola argues, provides a reason-giving basis for ethical evaluations in cases of conflict between the individual good of particular agents without appealing to any non-natural goods.

In the remainder of Part II, Mendola describes and defends a two-part method of moving from individual good to ethical evaluations. This is composed of the Leximin Desire Principle (LDP) and MAC2 (Multiple-Act Consequentialism plus a responsibility attribution principle). According to LDP, we ought to maximize the well-being of the worst-off atomic agents,[2] where the worst-off are identified in terms of consensus congruence (222). While LDP alone is typically sufficient for moral evaluations in cases of an isolated atomic agent's alternatives, Mendola notes that an atomic agent is often part of multiple group agents with conflicting aims.[3] To resolve these conflicts, Mendola proposes MAC, according to which:

(1) Direct consequentialist evaluation of the options of group or individual agents is appropriate.
(2) . . . one should only defect from a group act with good consequences if one can achieve better consequences by the defecting act alone than the entire group act achieves.
(3) When different beneficent group acts of which one is a part specify roles that conflict, one ought to follow the role in the group act with more valuable consequences.
(4) One ought to join whatever group acts it is consequentially best to join, given the [above] constraints [set by (2) and (3)]. (257)

Mendola calls principle (2) Very Little Defection (VLD) and principle (3) Defect to the Dominant (DD). MAC relies on Mendola's Part I account of group acts and agency, which is grounded in acceptance of reasons. According to Mendola, there is "a group action involving human agents" when:

(i) common action is taken by a number of these agents rooted in (ii) common true belief that there is a shared goal and (iii) acceptance by all the members of the group that there is a reason to continue to coordinate activity . . . whose acceptance we can expect to occasion criticism and the acceptance of criticism for failure to continue coordination until the point (if any) at which the goal is accomplished or mutually abandoned (81).

Finally, Mendola amends MAC with the addition of a claim regarding individual responsibility, yielding MAC2 -- which (in addition to the claims of MAC) "holds all non-defecting participants in a group act fully responsible for the whole" (272).

With these resources in hand, Mendola goes on to argue in Part III that, in virtue of our acceptance of highly general moral reasons, each of us is part of a group act of commonsense morality. And because it is consequentially best to join this group, those who are not currently participants in the group act of commonsense morality ought to join the group act -- due to clause (4) of MAC. This, Mendola argues, yields reasons to act in accordance with many particular deontic constraints.

In the remainder of this review, I would like to focus specifically on the group action and responsibility portion of Mendola's account. It is worth noting that there is a rapidly growing literature on group obligation in general, and the relationship between group and individual responsibility in particular, which Mendola does not discuss.[4] I do not intend this as a criticism of Mendola, since much of this work is so recent that it was likely published after the relevant portions of the book were written. Nonetheless, those who work in the area of group responsibility may be disappointed by the absence of engagement with current work which is relevant to VLD and MAC2's responsibility attribution principle.

Consider VLD. According to this principle, one ought not to defect from a group with good consequences in order to individually produce a different good unless the individual good is greater than the good to be produced by the group as a whole -- even if one's participation in the group is irrelevant to the good produced by the group. As Mendola is aware, however, this will strike many as counterintuitive.

Imagine the following voting case. It would be best if Candidate A were elected, and I am a member of a group that accepts reasons favoring the election of A. According to VLD, I ought to act in accordance with my role in the group, which, intuitively, involves casting my vote for A. Suppose, however, that given that the others in my group cast their votes for Candidate A, my vote will be superfluous (that is, A's election will be overdetermined). Additionally, suppose that by not voting, and instead volunteering at a soup kitchen, I could create a bit of extra good. According to VLD, I ought to cast my vote instead of volunteering (given that the election of Candidate A produces a greater good than my volunteering) -- but, I claim, this is implausible.

Mendola defends VLD by claiming, first, that "equal status for both sorts of agents" -- group agents and individual agents -- requires that the appropriate comparison must allow both factors (the group act and the individual act) to vary, such that the relevant comparison is between the outcome when my group does not vote and I volunteer, on one hand, and the outcome when my group (including me) votes and I do not volunteer, on the other. But given that in the case as described my participation has no bearing on whether the group act occurs, I do not see why equal consideration requires this comparison. Indeed, given that my actions do not affect the actions of other group members, it seems to me that in identifying what I ought to do it is perfectly appropriate for me to hold constant what others are going to do.

Mendola also argues, however, that (i) "to countenance defections from consequentially dominant group actions . . . is to open the possibility of frequent defection" (263); and (ii) there may be cases in which group membership itself forbids defection based on individual utility maximization. Regarding (ii), Mendola suggests that the successful functioning of a group may require trust that each member will refrain from such defection. It is implausible, however, that all beneficent group actions require this trust. And regarding response (i), I agree that widespread defection would likely be disastrous (263) -- but defection in special cases need not lead to massive, disastrous defection.

Mendola replies to this line of objection by claiming that "the smallest agent is surely not always the dominant locus of proper direct consequentialist evaluation," and that for this reason the general integrity of continuing acts requires non-defection (262). I do not see, however, why occasional defection by superfluous members must undermine cooperative action. It simply does not seem plausible that my defection in the voting case above would undermine the group action of electing Candidate A. (Of course, if enough group members pursued individual goods rather than voting, things would be different -- but then my voting would not involve a surplus good, and the case would be irrelevant to the question of whether defection is permissible in cases of surplus goods.)

Finally, Mendola offers an independent response to objections to VLD involving a clarification of his account of defection. According to Mendola, "you are only defecting from a group act if you would be criticized for that defection on grounds of violation of reasons accepted by the group" (273, my emphasis). Thus, perhaps in the voting case I would not be defecting from the group act of voting if I were to instead volunteer at the soup kitchen, because I would not be criticized for violating reasons accepted by the group. And if I would not be defecting, then VLD does not prohibit me from individually pursuing an "extra" good.

The difficulty with this strategy, it seems to me, is that it makes the moral permissibility of volunteering at the soup kitchen hinge implausibly on whether, while volunteering, I continue to accept that there is reason to elect Candidate A. If I decide that the election is not important after all -- and I thus focus entirely on the good of volunteering -- then I have clearly defected, and my volunteering is wrong according to MAC2. If Mendola's appeal to group criticism is successful, however, then if I volunteer at the soup kitchen and retain my acceptance of the importance of electing Candidate A, then I have not defected and MAC2 does not rule my action morally wrong. Given that I know that my participation in the election is irrelevant, however, it is implausible that my acceptance of election-related reasons makes a difference to the moral permissibility of my volunteering at the soup kitchen.

The possibility of overdetermination is also relevant to my second objection to MAC2, which centers on its attribution of full responsibility for a group act to each non-defecting group member (272). Consider the case of moral vegetarianism. Particularly given Mendola's arguments in Part III,[5] I take it that by purchasing and consuming meat (thereby not defecting from a group action which harms non-human animals), I am (according to Mendola's responsibility attribution principle) morally responsible for the entirety of the resulting harm to non-human animals. But it is plausible that my individual occasional meat consumption has no bearing whatsoever on the overall harm to non-human animals.[6] My intuition is that if the harm is overdetermined in this way, it is implausible that I am individually responsible for any of the resulting harm to animals -- but even if I am wrong about this, it is enough to undercut the responsibility attribution principle if I am not responsible for all of the harm.

Mendola, however, argues that full responsibility attribution is intuitive even in true overdetermination cases, appealing to Parfit's case of the Harmless Torturers. Each of us presses a button with the result that a victim suffers extreme pain, but no individual contribution by itself makes the pain perceptibly worse. According to Mendola, "each torturer is intuitively evil" (273). I simply do not have this intuition. Given that I cannot affect the behavior of the other button-pressers, it does not seem to me that it matters morally whether I push the button or not. Of course, there are epistemic difficulties here -- if I am uncertain as to what the other potential button-pressers will do, I agree that I ought not to push the button. But the case is designed so as to avoid this epistemic problem.

Mendola might respond that in these overdetermination cases I am not a member of the harm-causing group, as in neither case are my actions intentionally directed at the potential harm. This strategy is implausible, however, in cases of group omission (where the relevant harm is rarely intended); and it is in any case inconsistent with Mendola's Part III claims regarding individual responsibility for the effects of widespread harmful policies. Thus, I suggest that Mendola has not overcome the burden imposed by the intuitive implausibility of his responsibility attribution principle.

Even if my objections regarding Mendola's treatment of group action and responsibility are compelling, however, they in no way affect his account of individual good or his defense of the Leximin Desire Principle, and these alone make the book highly worth reading. Human Interests is an engaging and well-argued book covering an impressive range of topics in metaphysics and value theory, and it is an important contribution to the literature.


Goodin, Robert 2012. "Excused by the Unwillingness of Others?" Analysis 72.1: 18-24.

Lawford-Smith, Holly 2012. "The Feasibility of Collectives' Actions." Australasian Journal of Philosophy 90.3: 453-67.

Regan, Donald 1980. Utilitarianism and Cooperation, Oxford University Press.

Shafer-Landau, Russ 1994. "Vegetarianism, Causation, and Ethical Theory." Public Affairs Quarterly 8.1: 85-100.

Wringe, Bill 2014. "Collective Obligations: Their Existence, Their Explanatory Power, and Their Supervenience on the Obligations of Individuals." Forthcoming in the European Journal of Philosophy.

[1] Mendola also holds that the agents whose actions are subject to moral evaluation are atomic agents.

[2] If there are ties regarding improvement for the worst-off, then we ought to also maximize the well-being of the second-worst-off, etc.

[3] Mendola's justification for the need of something like MAC parallels Donald Regan's (1980) work on cooperative utilitarianism, although MAC differs from Regan's view in several important respects. (Puzzlingly, however, Regan's work is not cited in Mendola's discussion of MAC.)

[4] Note especially recent work by Holly Lawford-Smith (2012), Robert Goodin (2012), and Bill Wringe (2014).

[5] In Part III Mendola argues, for example, that the well-off in capitalist societies are party to a group act which disadvantages the worst off (384-88)

[6] See Shafer-Landau (1994).