Human Nature: The Categorial Framework

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P.M.S. Hacker, Human Nature: The Categorial Framework, Blackwell, 2007, 326pp., $100.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781405147286.

Reviewed by Michael Quante, Universität zu Köln


In the book's preface Hacker tells the reader: At "the end of my academic career, I felt a powerful urge to paint a last large fresco that would depict, sometimes with broad brush, sometimes in fine detail, themes which I had studied and reflected on for the last forty years" (xi). A few sentences later we read that this book, Human Nature: The Categorial Framework, is only the first volume of a trilogy, to be followed by a second on "the cognitive and cogitative powers" and a third on "the affective and moral powers" of human beings. Taken together one can assume that these three books will offer Hacker's philosophical anthropology in toto, a large fresco of human nature.

Hacker's overall aim is to locate "the forms of description of human nature in the general conceptual scheme in terms of which we describe all else" (4). He claims to offer the reader "a perspicuous representation of the most fundamental concepts and conceptual forms in terms of which we think about ourselves" (xi). Looking at the titles of the nine chapters following the first one in which the overall project of this book is characterised, the reader can see what these "most fundamental concepts and conceptual forms" are in Hacker's eyes: substance (chapter 2), causation (chapter 3), powers (chapter 4), agency (chapter 5), teleology and teleological explanation (chapter 6), reasons and explanations of human action (chapter 7), the mind (chapter 8), the self and the body (chapter 9), and -- last but not least -- the person (chapter 10).

In this review I could not do justice to what Hacker presents in detail, so I shall not try. The book is full of very helpful distinctions and arguments which show in many different ways how carefully we must proceed when we do philosophy and how sensitive we must be to contexts. A lot of Hacker's arguments consist in showing that some ways of framing philosophical questions stem from narrowing down the linguistic data (something Wittgenstein once labelled "einseitige Diät"), or from taking one way of speaking or one kind of explanation as the only one, or from following one kind of picture exclusively, or from neglecting legitimate ways of speaking which might deliver counter-evidence or which might at least open more conceptual space and allow for more flexibility. Many more of Hacker's arguments are based on the claim that some important strands in modern and contemporary philosophy have purported to develop and defend a philosophical programme (e.g. the causal theory of action explanation or substance dualism in the philosophy of mind) but never managed to fulfil their promises. The most thoroughgoing arguments the reader can find in Hacker's book are of the therapeutic kind: Hacker is at his best when he demonstrates -- sometimes by a tour de force through the history of philosophy -- that many contemporary philosophical problems are simply not solvable but can only be dissolved by criticising the premises needed to formulate the problems.

Because all these arguments against the misunderstandings in past and present philosophy are of such a fundamental kind, Hacker does not need to follow all the recent discussions in detail since he thinks that contemporary analytical philosophy is deeply infected by a disease which is in need of analysis and therapy (I will come back to this at the end of my review).

All of this comes as no surprise since Hacker's approach is deeply influenced by the philosophy of the later Wittgenstein on the one hand and by an overall Aristotelian account of human nature and our basic conceptual framework on the other. Readers not familiar with the later Wittgenstein or with Hacker's famous interpretations of him might wish to read Hacker’s Wittgenstein's Place in Twentieth-Century Analytic Philosophy (1996) in conjunction with Hacker’s new book. That said, although Wittgenstein and his philosophical method are an essential part of Hacker's approach, the present book is intended to, and does, stand on its own.

Readers should keep in mind Hacker’s remark in his preface that two more volumes are "in the making" since this is intended to block questions the reader might feel the urge to ask about whether Hacker's overall approach is idealistic in the epistemic sense, or whether it is a version of relativism. Relativism, for instance, can have very different meanings, some of them proper to epistemology and some to ethics. Both can give rise to serious and deep questions, but both are postponed until the forthcoming volumes. Nevertheless, Hacker's analysis of the categorial framework cannot completely avoid the fact that one is inclined to ask to whom he refers when he speaks of "our conceptual scheme" (4). At some places -- and these are not trivial ones -- Hacker notices that there are basic differences between natural languages which can give rise to deep philosophical differences: "German, for example, uses Leib (a cognate of Leben) or Körper (derived from corpus) to signify the living body, and Leiche to signify the corpse" (272 f.). As we all know, things are different in the English language, and some of the philosophical problems arising in the mind-body-debate can be traced back to this difference in the German and the English conceptual scheme (as Hacker is well aware). Another quote which makes a similar suggestion is the following:

We are trying to understand the structure of a fragment of our conceptual scheme. That we speak of ourselves as having a mind is a crucial aspect of our discourse about human beings. [Footnote omitted; MQ] These are far from universal (many languages, even closely related languages such as German, do not have a word that corresponds precisely to 'mind'). (248)

This could, and to my mind should, be taken as the idea that each natural language organizes its way of conceptually dealing with the world differently than each other natural language does, so that not every word in one natural language has a direct counterpart in another. But -- at least at this place in his book -- Hacker is very defensive, giving a very narrow interpretation of "our scheme of things" when he writes: "But our idioms are the flowers that the genius of English has naturally grown, and they cover the terrain that we are trying to survey" (248). Earlier in the book we are told a different story:

The theme of the following philosophical investigations is human nature. But it is simultaneously the grammar of the description of what is distinctively human. And it is the former because it is the latter. For the investigations are purely conceptual. They explore the concepts and conceptual forms we employ in our thought and talk about ourselves, and examine the logico-grammatical relationship between these concepts and conceptual forms. (7)

Since the book does not deal with contemporary English philosophical anthropology I hope that "our" here means something stronger and philosophically more ambitious than it does in the previous passage.

What went wrong in modern and contemporary analytical philosophy? Put in a nutshell it is the orientation to the cognitive project of the natural sciences which deeply infects and distorts philosophical thinking. Against this orientation, Hacker claims that "philosophy is not the handmaiden of science" (75) and shows how profoundly this ill-guided self-understanding has shaped contemporary philosophical thinking. Similarly (and also against reversionary metaphysics), Hacker defends the meta-philosophical thesis that "the task of philosophy is not to generate novel concepts and conceptual connections for use in the empirical sciences or for use in everyday discourse. Rather, it is to clarify existing concepts and conceptual connections and to discern the very general patterns they exhibit" (12). As Hacker hastens to add immediately, this should not be understood as mere description of language use, as "a form of glorified lexicography" (14), since philosophy is free to "introduce new distinctions among concepts or classes of concepts, or between different kinds of propositions for purposes of philosophical illumination" (12). Philosophy is a project having an aim and worth of its own, it aims at "disentangling" the "knots that we have tied in our understanding" and tries to deliver an "explanation of how we tied them and why they hold us captive". Taken this way these "primary goals" of philosophy deliver "a full justification for the activity of philosophical clarification" (13). Certainly one might wonder what the measure is to show that "the dissolution of misconceptions about our nature and the attainment of a correct [my emphasis, MQ] conception" (13) has been successfully carried out. If we agree that 'our' (whoever this includes) uses of words might be misguided or the concepts we use corrupt, we might wonder what defines correctness here. If our uses vary during history (e.g. because the historical and social contexts change) and are open to infections, it is idle to hope to gain stable ground by mere description alone. This may be right, but must we wait until the third volume of Human Nature appears, when we need an ethical reading of "correctness" here and now?

Maybe Hacker has (just as the later Wittgenstein had) a price to pay for his philosophical method which mainly has the objective of saving the autonomy of philosophy and blocking the imperialism of the scientific worldview. In the chapter in which he deals with "substances conceived as natural kinds" (45), Hacker criticises the idea that the meaning of natural kind terms depends on what the "real essence" (45) is of the natural kinds they refer to. This real essence, taken as a "microstructural real essence", is "conceived to be partly constitutive of the meaning of the natural kind name" (46). In this externalist conception of natural kind terms and natural kinds, "scientific discovery holds a blank cheque from semantics, which it can fill in as science progresses" (46).

It is evident that Hacker has to reject this conception and his reply comes at no surprise:

It is doubtful whether the categories found to be useful in the natural sciences are themselves natural kind terms thus understood. For this [the externalist conception of Hilary Putnam; MQ] conception of natural kinds is a metaphysical rather than a scientific one, rooted in a form of metaphysical essentialism, on the one hand, and misconceptions concerning meaning and explanation, on the other. (46)

I am not persuaded that scientism is the only argument (or motive) for such an externalist analysis but I agree that such a conception is a metaphysical and not a scientific one. As such it is on the same level as the philosophical method Hacker suggests for philosophical anthropology. But although I agree that "it is an illusion that scientific discovery can disclose what the words we use, such as 'gold' and 'water', 'fish' and 'lily', really mean" (46), it might be the case that there are good -- maybe philosophical -- reasons for us to let science play that role in certain contexts.

If we remind ourselves that parts of scientific theories (concepts, conceptions and propositions) can trickle down into 'our' daily conceptual scheme, as those parts of former philosophies Hacker has identified in his historical cum therapeutic analysis (e.g. in the chapters devoted to the mind, the self and the body, or the person) have done in the past, it is very optimistic -- to say the least -- to assume that we are in a position to identify the real or "correct" conception beyond or besides such possibly corrupted or infected concepts and conceptions by the philosophical method of therapy alone. And if we take into account that science enters our Lebenswelt via technological development and technical intervention it is not even clear that every modification of our conceptual scheme is a corruption. If we agree with Hacker's basic claim that human beings are both autonomous agents and human organisms we have to discuss how these two aspects and their interrelation is modified by technical developments, e.g. in biotechnology and the life sciences. The role technology can play in relation to human nature has been an integral part of philosophical anthropology and it is not easy to see how this question can be integrated in Hacker's "large fresco". Certainly we can understand his claim that scientific "discovery may be elevated into convention by agreement on a new rule for the use of a word" (46) in such a way that this elevation can take place via an adaptation of our daily conceptual scheme adjusted to our technological world or in more theoretically guided ways. But it is very plausible to assume that this "elevation" also will have to take into account ethical aspects since such an elevation may have effects on the way we live our lives. So probably we will have to wait until the third volume of Human Nature before we can decide whether Hacker's philosophical anthropology will be able to deal with this aspect of the conditio humana without giving up the philosophical method on which it is built.