Human Rights as a Way of Life: On Bergson's Political Philosophy

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Alexandre Lefebvre, Human Rights as a Way of Life: On Bergson's Political Philosophy, Stanford University Press, 2013, 181pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804785792.

Reviewed by Michael R. Kelly, University of San Diego


It's become something of a cliché when writing about Bergson these days to note his unfortunate philosophical fate. But perhaps nowhere more than in human rights discussions does it make sense to highlight just how surprising is the neglect of his thought. The principle drafter of the Universal Declaration of Human Rights, John Peters Humphrey, came to see in that document the spirit of Bergson's Two Sources of Morality and Religion (1932) (TSMR). Bergson has largely been forgotten since then, despite also his work with Woodrow Wilson's administration in creating the League of Nations and his presiding over the precursor to UNESCO, the International Commission for Intellectual Cooperation (xvi). Bergson's own concerns about human rights were likely more practical than theoretical -- his writings develop no sustained account of human rights. Despite the lack of such a sustained account,  Alexandre Lefebvre's new book constructs a Bergsonian theory of human rights on the basis of what can be found in TSMR.

Through a distinctive interpretation of TSMR, Lefebvre's provocative work of genuine, scholarly creativity is the first monograph on human rights devoted to Bergson's thought and the first monograph on Bergson devoted to developing his "genuinely new way to think about [human rights]" (xv). On Lefebvre's reading of Bergson, human rights perform their conventional function, namely, "to protect all human beings from serious abuse," as well as a further function that Bergson identified when he developed "the first and only account of human rights as a medium to improve upon, relate to, and care for ourselves" (xv). Taking these complementary functions together -- protection of others and care for self -- Lefebvre works out the Bergsonian thesis that "love" is the nature or "essence of human rights" (70), for "in order to protect all human beings . . . and realize global social justice, human rights . . . must first of all be based in a metamorphosis of the self . . . a process of conversion" (73). Lefebvre thus endeavors to open a "new research problematic" that includes the generation of "new readings of key thinkers in the history of human rights" and the exploration of a "mutually illuminating encounter between human rights and the theory and practice of self-care" (140-41). He achieves the former end more convincingly but presents a case for the latter with which human rights theorists must reckon.

Scholars pursuing this issue in continental and analytical philosophy (as well as across academic disciplines such as political science, government, international relations, religious studies, sociology, etc.) should read Lefebvre's (and Bergson's) book. Lefebvre offers readers unfamiliar with Bergson's philosophy and his TSMR clear introductions to both. Beyond these introductions, he presents a Bergson infused with the thought of Pierre Hadot and Michel Foucault in dialogue with contemporary human rights theorists, including (but not limited to) Michael Ignatieff (27, 136-38), Christine Korsgaard (51, 55-7, 68-9), Richard Rorty (27-8, 41), Peter Singer (27, 51, 55-7, 68-9), Alain Badiou (134-36), and renowned primatologist, Frans de Waal (25, 27, 51-7, 100-01). The text thus presents a broad range of readers with the opportunity to evaluate both Bergson's ethical/political theory and Lefebvre's Bergsonian view of human rights from the perspective of Bergson studies or human rights scholarship, or both.

The work is divided into two main parts and seven chapters. Part one, "Human Rights and the Picture of Morality," is largely critical and presents Bergsonian philosophical concerns about attempts to ground human rights in theories of social and moral obligation, which Bergson's unique evolutionary philosophy concluded always remains closed (i.e., limited or exclusionary). Chapter one explains Bergson's reservations about the common (and philosophical) understanding of human rights as an institution grown out of a sense of obligation one feels for progressively larger 'in-groups', e.g., from family to city to fellow country-men to humanity. Such a view of the foundation of human rights misunderstands the place of war in the human condition, a necessary rather than accidental feature of human nature and society (23, 84). War "tells us that moral obligation is exclusive" (13).

Lefebvre explains the reasons for and implications of this conclusion in chapter two, "Bergson's Critical Philosophy." Situating TSMR within his broader corpus, Lefebvre clearly and succinctly outlines Bergson's view of intelligence as a tool developed by life, the élan vital, to solve problems and ensure survival. Social and moral obligations are one such evolutionary tool; they arise due to a need and provide rules to ensure the survival, stability, and cohesion of a group living together and, in turn, protection of that group against outside groups. On Bergson's unique evolutionary account, obligation is rooted in the tendencies in the élan vital, and he holds that "war promotes the evolution of sociability and societies wage war".  For this reason, moral obligation is exposed as exclusionary, limited by nature and function, and thus incapable of providing the foundation for human rights (24-5). Bergson's "single most important . . . [and] only critique" of human rights, then, is that obligation ends, gives way to war, when an 'out-group' threatens the 'in-group', thus becoming, in "Hannah Arendt's cutting phrase, 'the uncertain sentiment of professional idealists'" (12). Perhaps because Bergson believes that "the natural aggressiveness and . . . sociability . . . of the human species . . . are co-original," Lefebvre makes no mention here of the Hobbesian view of war as natural and motivating a tenuous sociability (23). Bergson's view perhaps expresses a variation on the 'asocial sociability' of humanity, but following Bergson's text here closer than human rights theory, Lefebvre gives only a critique of Kantian practical philosophy, which is a shame given the significance of Kant's political writings for human rights theory (23). The conclusion of this chapter is something like a proposal for a new research program concerning the "fundamental difference" between Bergson and a group Lefebvre labels the "post-metaphysical" theorists of human rights, "thinkers as diverse as John Rawls, Michael Ignatieff, Martha Nussbaum, Jürgen Habermas, and Richard Rorty" (27). Unlike these 'post-metaphysical' thinkers, Bergson explores "basic facts of human nature in order to determine what can and what cannot serve as a foundation for human rights" (28).

Chapters three and four examine in more detail theories that cannot serve as a foundation for human rights. Chapter three, "The Closed Society: Bergson on Durkheim," applies the findings of the first two chapters to Bergson's rejection of the separation of "morality and society from biology" upon which Durkheim establishes his theory of moral duties (36). If Durkheim overlooked the biological source of moral obligation (and thus its closed and exclusionary character that undermines its adequacy as a foundation for human rights), the so-called rationalist or intellectualist accounts of human rights overlooked the biological source of obligation, favoring reason over both 'nature' (biology) and social pressure (Durkheim) as a source of moral obligation. Durkheim captured what was "forceful" about moral obligation but relative and closed: the rationalist account of obligation "is perfectly universal but without force" (50).

Chapter four, "Human Rights and the Critique of Practical Reason," explains the lack of appeal in rationalist accounts of obligation. Rationalists such as Singer and Korsgaard maintain that practical reason (as a mode of intelligence) takes humans beyond the bounds of evolved nature (reason over passion, universalism over the 'dear self') and eventually to human rights. That humans are unique moral animals, Lefebvre maintains, and Bergson agrees. But intelligence's biological origins render reason incapable of protecting us from the dangers of closed morality. Bergson thus holds that "reason . . . is not [moral life's] source . . . nor is it the primary motivation to moral life" (69). The motivating force of a value insight (and thus moral life) for Bergson is emotion, specifically the emotion of love, "the essence of human rights." For Lefebvre, human rights "protect us from the love of the closed society," which confines itself "to fellow citizens and regards outsiders with hatred and alienation," but they also "turn us toward a qualitatively different kind of love" (70). Following Bergson, Lefebvre rightly notes that only one of the kinds of love differs in kind from reason as a motivating value insight. One love aligns with and responds to the intellect and the evolutionary demand for self-preservation that produces (participation in) the closed society; the other, a creative emotion different in kind (from reason and its emotional handmaiden), protects us from the hate entailed in closed societies and opens us to "open love" (TSMR )

Although Lefebvre takes as part of his task in Part Two unpacking what is meant by this creative emotion that presents an alternative to reason as the primary and forceful motivation to moral life -- and thus human rights -- further explanation is needed to defend the claim that reason is not intrinsically motivating with respect to obligation and human rights. That this is Bergson's position in TSMR, I don't dispute, for he holds that an 'evolved' intellect (tied to the desire for social cohesion serving self-interest and survival) cannot conceptualize that which is so far from us spatially and conceptually; rational considerations of that sector of humanity 'over there' lack force, lack appeal (TSMR 32-7). But this critique of rationalism and the proposed alternative of open love with respect to the motivational force of a value insight require more unpacking, especially since the difference in kind in these loves figures so prominently in the second, positive portion of Lefebvre's work.[1]

Since according to Lefebvre human rights must convert us to an open love that will provide substance for commitment to human rights so that it can protect us from closed love, chapter five, "Human Rights as Conversion," the first section of part two, focuses on conversion. Lefebvre sees in Hadot's etymological account of the dual meaning of the Latin conversio the very function of human rights, namely, "to turn or redirect the state and send it in a different direction," a turning designed to "undertake 'a total transformation in personality' of individual human beings" (76-7). The first turning begets yet depends upon the success of the second. As evidence for the mutual dependence of these functions of human rights and priority of the second turning ("the idea of conversion") over the first, Lefebvre draws our attention to the preambles of the two foundational texts of human rights, "The Declaration of the Rights of Man and Citizen" (1789) and "The Universal Declaration of Human Rights" (1948). Lefebvre's Bergson holds that each document takes as its "principle addressee . . . not government or a people [but] instead each and every individual person" (78). Human rights do not attempt through sanction or punishment to move the person to the kind of self-renunciation that might make possible the satisfaction of our duties and obligations toward humanity when they seem inconvenient or threatening to oneself or one's society. Indeed, they cannot. Hence, they must move the person -- emovere -- to want to voluntarily improve because s/he wants to better and take care of her/himself (79). One cannot reason oneself into aligning with progressively larger loves; one must fundamentally change one's outlook on love, switch from a closed, self-serving love to an open, self-sacrificing love that leaves no room for hatred, discrimination, or exclusion of any type.

In this chapter's conclusion Lefebvre squarely addresses a looming tension, namely, that human rights are not ordinarily understood as a type of conversion rooted in open love. For Lefebvre, good reason exists to believe these fundamental human-rights documents aim at conversion of the individual. It "simply makes good practical sense," i.e., it "is expedient for these documents to sketch a vision of human rights as conversion," for insofar as human rights "lack enforcement" the framers of these documents realized the need to appeal to "the individual subject in order to be effective" (81).

Incapable of obligating people to love one another or punishing them when they neglect the other, Lefebvre suggests that human rights elicit through example a new kind of love in individual human beings; this new kind of love is the main focus of chapter six, "The Open Society." Historically, the "works of love" of mystics provide examples of the open love that human rights try to model. Lefebvre develops this suggestion by providing close readings of the few pages in TSMR where Bergson discusses human rights. In a rather clever move, he explains the absence of a theory -- indeed of a developed discussion -- of human rights in TSMR on the grounds that "they are not one topic among others . . . [but] . . . the very core of [Bergson's] vision of politics . . . the political institution that most fully embodies his ideal of 'love' and the 'open society' . . . " (xv, 9, 83). What can be seen in history is that work of the mystics -- and presumably the potential of human rights -- in fact has stopped human society from destroying itself through war. Open love "breaks down the boundaries of the closed society" (88), and human rights function "to initiate all human beings into open love" (99). It is difficult to understand what makes such claims more defensible than the claim that closed (self-) love stops humanity from destroying itself by war. Rather than provide a reasoned defense of this insight -- concerning how works of (open) love overcome the closure of society (and war) -- Lefebvre prefers to follow Bergson and point to instances when (open) love has "turn[ed] us from a way of life in which exclusion and preference are the innermost core of morality" (88).

Representative examples of this achievement are the Sermon on the Mount and the Declaration of the Rights of Man. Lefebvre's interpretation of Bergson's account of love in these 'documents' (implicitly) appeals to two dominant theories of love in western philosophy, the Platonic or erotic and the Christian or agapic. Lefebvre does not explicitly distinguish these two theories of love, providing instead examples of open love as found in Vladimir Jankelevitch, Louis Lavelle, Gilles Deleuze, and J. M. Coetzee (92-100). Lefebvre's discussion of the open love and open society, as I understand it, reveals that the Platonic model, which responds to the presence of desirable features or properties in another or a society, is (or models the) closed society; alternatively, the agapic model, which bestows love on another or a society regardless of the absence of desirable or the presence of undesirable features in them, is (or models the) open society. Open love, he writes, does not love "because" it is "not elicited by a particular object . . . that is for closed love to do" (91-2). In this way, open love and Lefebvre's portraits of it "are preoccupied with care of others. . . . a care made possible only once love ceases to be dedicated to a specific object" (100). Lefebvre's Bergson thus holds that "love performs a transcendental function," that open and closed love "each present . . . a different world" (96). There is a tension between this claim and Lefebvre's insistence that Bergson's account "is vitalist through and through" (104), but Lefebvre returns in chapter seven, "The Two Faces of Human Rights," to the vitalist interpretation of the nature and function of the two kinds of love present in human rights.

This chapter examines the historical manifestations of these evolutionary emergences of open love through a more detailed account of religion, particularly the Christian religion emphasized by Bergson in his discussions of human rights in TSMR but rendered more ecumenical by Lefebvre's highlighting of human rights construed as analogues to open, religious love (111-18). Lefebvre advances the fascinating thesis that human rights are "religious" insofar as "point by point human rights match . . . what is truly religious in religion" (112). The idea is that human rights, like religion, endorse a view of love without preference for (and by implication the exclusion of) a particular object or group. The open love of religion and human rights does not transcend (human) nature's tendency toward the closed but promotes the realization of this qualitatively different tendency in life. Each institution achieves this end by transforming the mystic's (or, perhaps, the activist's or framing-author's) otherwise incomprehensible open love into intelligible doctrines. While these doctrines or teaching necessarily distort the nature of truly open love, codifying them and rendering them stagnant, they nevertheless make the sentiments of dynamic, open love accessible to average human beings and thus "initiate" them into an aspiration to open love and the actualization of the universal duty we have to all humanity (118).

Both religion and human rights, then, are "mixed": closed and open, articulated and felt, pressuring and aspirant. In concrete experience, the difference between these kinds of love is heuristic (119) and "there is no such thing as a closed or an open human society: the former would amount to a society of ants, the latter to a society of Christs." Nevertheless, since these heuristics can motivate conversion, a change of heart in the here and now, the open and the closed are not "regulative ideals" (120), a claim Lefebvre could untangle better from his earlier claim that human rights are the institution that most fully embodies the ideal of love and the open society (83).

Lefebvre's view of human rights as a way of life is thus twofold. Human rights express a way of life (metaphysically speaking), a tendency toward the open, unbiased, unprejudiced love (109). Striving to bring about an affective insight and a conversion in the individual human being to a new way of perceiving, a different practical attitude toward the world, human rights also promote 'a way of life', an ethos (96).

But if life and human rights remain a mixture of the closed and the open -- neither of which tendency can be completely actualized or thought of as a regulative ideal -- there is precedent to suggest that Bergson's view of human rights isolates what is Christian about Christianity more than what is broadly religious about religion. As Augustinian political philosophers have noted, the City of God (based on a life aligned with the open love of Christ) and the City of man (based on a life aligned with the closed, self-love of fallen human beings) are "for all practical purposes inextricably mixed."[2] Both talk of two loves and two tendencies, but a Bergsonian account will have to explain how we break free from the evolutionary function of our useful habits, our duties and closed loves, to actualize open love. On Bergson's vitalist account and Lefebvre's provocative interpretation, it is not clear if the road less travelled of open love is one freely chosen or one onto which we are pushed, for reasons we know not, by the élan vital, and this makes all the difference because we need to know if the individual human being is, is not, or should be responsible for the conversion to a love that will give substance to human rights.

Such reservations aside, Lefebvre's work returns us to a nest of central questions in political philosophy and human-rights literature by returning these discussions to the level of the everyday agent -- whether she comports herself with a closed or open love, an attitude or disposition that weakens or strengthens her commitment to human rights. As such, this work returns political philosophy and human-rights theory to 'a way of life', and it should be read closely and taken seriously.[3]

[1] Admittedly, Bergson's argument on this point (concerning emotion and its relation to reason in the context of the motivational force needed to make the universal practical rather than idealistic and theoretical) requires a good deal of reconstruction. Lefebvre notes rightly that, "Bergson's objection to rationalism is that only an emotion is able to oppose anotheremotion. . . . Hence the primary importance of love for Bergson: it is the right kind of phenomenon to check the pressure of the closed tendency" (70). But there doesn't seem to me to be reason to accept these claims prima facie. My recent attempt to reconstruct Bergson's argument on this score might compliment and complement Lefebvre's claims: "A Reading of Two Sources of Morality and Religion, Or Bergsonian Wisdom, Emotion, and Integrity" in Understanding Bergson Understanding Modernism, ed. P. Ardoin, S. E. Gontarski, and L. Mattison (London: Bloomsbury, 2013), pp. 70-88, esp., pp. 76-81.

[2] E. Fortin, Classical Christianity and the Political Order. Ernest L. Fortin: Collected Essays Volume 2, ed. J. Brian Benestad (Maryland: Rowmand & Littlefield Publishers, 1996), p. 20. Augustine, City of God, XIV.28.1-7: "And therefore two loves made two cities; the earthly city loves itself even to the contempt for God, the heavenly city truly loves God even to the contempt of self. In short, one is glorified in itself, this one glorified in God. That one, for instance, seeks after glory from men, but this one's greatest glory is God, the witness of conscience. That one exalts its head in his own glory, this one says to God: You are my glory and exalt my head." Thanks to Brian Harding for pointing me to this passage.

[3] Thanks to Chris Arroyo, Brian Harding, and Lori Watson for helpful comments on an earlier draft.