Human Rights: The Hard Questions

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Cindy Holder and David Reidy (eds.), Human Rights: The Hard Questions, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 472pp., $34.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521176262.

Reviewed by Mathias Risse, Harvard University


This is an anthology of 23 articles organized in seven parts that explore an eponymous set of hard questions about human rights. The titles of the different parts are "What Are Human Rights?," "How Do Human Rights Relate to Group Rights and Culture?," "What Do Human Rights Require of the Global Economy?," "How Do Human Rights Relate to Environmental Policy?," "Is There a Human Right to Democracy?," "What Are the Limits of Rights Enforcement?," and "Are Human Rights Progressive?" Cindy Holder and David Reidy have done a fine job assembling very useful discussions on many of the questions about human rights that keep philosophers, lawyers, political scientists, anthropologists and others busy.

A number of these questions have been around for quite some time, such as the question of whether human rights presuppose an account of human nature, how to think about the relationship between the alleged universality of human rights and cultural difference, and whether there is a human right to democracy. Others have come onto the agenda more recently, such as questions about the responsibility of business for human rights, the connection between climate change and human rights and questions about the localization or vernacularization of human rights. This would not be a great "first book" on human rights for an independent reader. However, many of the articles could serve as useful introductory texts in an advanced undergraduate or master's level course on human rights across disciplines but ideally with an interdisciplinary orientation. In fact, I know of no other book that would be equally useful for that purpose.

The contributors come from different disciplines (mostly the ones mentioned earlier), and one benefit of reading through the volume as a whole is that it provides a refreshing sense of how human rights issues are discussed across different fields. The reader also gets a plethora of welcome literature suggestions in the references. Most (though unfortunately not all) the authors make an effort to discuss their material in a manner that makes it accessible to those who do not share the same disciplinary background. In what follows I briefly discuss each of the seven parts of this anthology, though I will not comment on every article. Which articles I touch on is largely a reflection of my own interests in the human rights domain. One strength of this volume is that it can accommodate students and researchers with multifarious research interests.

Part I includes three essays under the heading of "What are Human Rights?" This is one of the largest topics one could raise in the domain of human rights. It is also a question that has come in for sustained debate in recent times, and that to my mind is the central debate about human rights among philosophers at the moment. The three articles do not even offer a survey of that kind of work (which is one reason why I think this is not a good "first book" on human rights), but instead choose three particular components of that guiding question. Chris Brown's excellent article "Human rights and human nature" argues that a successful theory of human rights needs to integrate an account of human nature. This standpoint has been rejected by Marxist political economists (who, leaving behind Marx's own early reflections on human "species being," insisted that the mode of production makes people who are they are) and Durkheimian sociologists (who sought to limit explanatory power to social facts alone), as well as by philosophers and anthropologist who were often eager to reject the notion of human nature on behalf of increased racial tolerance. But a notion of human rights will remain on thin ice if there is no notion of the "human" that could be used to substantiate those rights. Brown argues, quite sensibly, that at an appropriately abstract level we can indeed make sense of "human nature," and doing so at that level is enough for the purposes of constructing a theory of human rights.

Brown's essay is a terrific opening. The other two essays in this part are Neil Walker's "Universalism and particularism in human rights," and Rex Martin's "Are human rights universal?" Walker offers a very nuanced discussion of how to combine the universalist's aspirations of human rights with the particularist's insistence of the normative preeminence of local peculiarities. Martin distinguishes various meanings of the idea that human rights are universal and proposes a view of the matter that would cover the whole Universal Declaration of Human Rights. I suspect I am not alone to think that he is a bit too generous with his notion of universality, but his article in any event is a great starting point for further discussion. One regret I had was that the editors did not include a contribution that would respond to the question of "what are human rights" by arguing that they do not exist or by taking up some other non-mainstream, contrarian perspective. As human rights become more entrenched, the contrarian perspectives become more important.

Part II is devoted to the relationship of human rights and group rights. One topic covered here is moral relativism. Alison Renteln's "The significance of cultural differences for human rights" covers the standard issues about human rights and relativism quite well. What is especially interesting is how she explores several of the better known kinds of cases where human rights seem to conflict with local cultural norms in a way that provides ammunition to defenders of cultural relativism. These cases include (among others) female genital cutting, corporal punishment for children within the family, certain gendered religious practices, and different ideas about disability. Her discussion is very elementary though and, in fact, among the most elementary in this book. More sophisticated versions of relativism, such as Gilbert Harman's, which one could readily discuss in an advanced undergraduate class, make no appearance. One would have hoped that the editors would have made sure all articles would be directed at a readership of roughly the same academic level.

Peter Jones's "Groups and human rights" takes up the question of how human rights relate to rights of groups. The idea that certain groups have a right to self-determination stands in an uneasy relationship with the human rights of individuals. One place to locate a potential conflict is the Charter of the United Nations, which champions both self-determination of peoples and human rights of individuals. Assuming we can make sense of, and find moral urgency in, the idea of human rights, the right of collective self-determination comes under siege. The problem can be solved, argues Jones, if we distinguish between a "corporate" understanding of the group and a "collective" understanding. According to the corporate understanding the group is a separate entity, an "it" that could have rights. But Jones finds it hard to make sense of that understanding for the purposes of ascribing human rights, since if groups could have human rights only in such a way, they simply could not have them, and then the threat to the ideal of a collective right to self-determination would materialize. However, on the collective sense of group-identity a group would not be an "it" with rights of its own but a "we" in which the individual group members hold the right in question in conjunction with others. On such an understanding, some group rights could also be human rights, and in that case the conflict between self-determination and human rights would become more tractable. Overall, Jones makes a good case that human rights could and sometimes should also be understood in this collective way. After all, human rights might protect some aspects of individual lives that pertain to individuals in isolation, but also aspects that pertain to their collective lives with others.

The articles in this second part are completed by Ayelet Shachar's "Entangled: family, religion, and human rights" and Claudio Corradetti's "What does cultural difference require of human rights?"

Part III takes up the question of "What do human rights require of the global economy?" The Universal Declaration of Human Rights, in its preamble, makes clear that it addresses all individuals and all organs of society. While this formulation was presumably deliberately encompassing, the world of 1948 was very much a world of states. The Cold War that subsequently dominated world politics also was an affair of states. Since the end of the Cold War the dominant theme of world politics is globalization, an ongoing process of increasing political, economic, legal and social interconnectedness that has substantially limited the power of nation states in many dimensions and at the same time exposed individuals to the power of many entities other than states whose power is itself not always straightforwardly regulated by states. This also means the human rights of individuals can be violated by entities that are not straightforwardly regulated by states. Both legally and in many philosophical accounts states are regarded as the sole or at least the primary duty-holders with obligations in the human rights domain. But in a globalizing world we must reflect on the human rights obligations of other entities, such as intergovernmental organizations and multinational corporations.

Both Adam McBeth's "What do human rights require of the global economy? Beyond a narrow legal view" and Tony Evans's "Universal human rights in the global political economy" address that question, McBeth approaching them as a lawyer and Evans as a political scientist. Evans's piece is mostly diagnostic, the thrust being that the human rights regime dovetailed with a world of states that is now changing. It becomes a challenge then to adjust the human rights regime to the new world that globalization is producing. McBeth offers an interpretation of the international human rights regime that makes the purpose of human rights central and argues that obligations should be allocated in accordance with those purposes. He believes that at the level of principle this point is widely accepted, as is the implication that this would assign human rights obligations also to intergovernmental organizations and multinational corporations. But as far as the operationalization of these ideas is concerned, we are just at the beginning. An interesting case study here is the recent work of the UN Special Representative for the domain of business and human rights. That Special Representative's work ended with the submission of a number of guiding principles that were widely endorsed from within the UN system. Now it remains to be seen how these principles will be implemented.

The remaining contribution in this part is Ann Cudd's "Human rights and global equal opportunity: inclusion not provision." Cudd takes up the longstanding question of whether equality of opportunity should be considered an ideal at the global level, and whether a commitment to human rights would entail a commitment to a global ideal of equality of opportunity. She responds with a very qualified affirmative answer. Equality of opportunity does indeed constitute a global ideal, but as such it centrally involves inclusion (in educational systems and labor markets, for instance) rather than the provision of a range of opportunities across the board.

Part IV takes up the question of "How do human rights relate to environmental policy?" Stephen Gardiner's excellent essay "Human rights in a hostile climate" deals with the role that human rights discourse can play in formulating philosophical accounts of and reactions to climate change. In one way of thinking about his essay the target is Simon Caney's argument that human-engineered climate change is a (massive) human rights violation and needs to be terminated on that account. Personally I have always thought that this argument is somehow a mismatch. Of course, climate change is also a human rights violation, but that characterization seems to fall short of capturing the true magnitude of the problem. Gardiner concurs, and he teases out in very plausible ways just how that characterization falls short.

One issue is that human rights violations are normally concerned with the complaints of individuals against their governments. But as Gardiner has demonstrated in his book A Perfect Moral Storm: The Ethical Tragedy of Climate Change, climate change is a global and intergenerational problem where the latter dimension is particularly striking. Of course, there is a way of thinking of the scope of human rights talk as broad enough so that human rights of future generations are also affected. But the very effort of integrating climate change issues into human rights talk also opens it up to the kind of moral corruption Gardiner notes in many applications of moral discourse to climate change. Using a particular kind of moral approach opens up opportunities of favoring the concerns of some constituents over those of others. In light of the intergenerational nature of this particular problem the danger is that the concerns of contemporaries will be overemphasized because of the necessary absence of representatives of future generations. Human rights talk in particular would be susceptible to that kind of corruption. There are other issues as well, but the upshot is that turning to human rights when it comes to climate change might generate more questions than it solves because it does not make the intergenerational component of the problem central.

Gail Karlsson's essay "A human rights approach to energy, poverty and gender inequality" is concerned with the exploration of the interconnection between the three topics listed in the title. The key message is that the human rights of women must be strengthened to make sure women can have their fair share of the world's energy supply and so that their disproportionate share among the poor decreases. Kristin Shrader-Frechette's essay "Pollution wolves in scientific sheep's clothing: why environmental-risk assessors and policy-makers ignore the 'hard issues' of the human rights of pollution victims" reflects on human rights issues that arise from the strong presence of pollutants in the environment.

Part V explores the question "Is there a human right to democracy?" Hilary Charlesworth's essay "Is there a human right to democracy?" explores the eponymous question from the standpoint of international law, whereas Carol Gould's "The human right to democracy and its global import" and Thomas Christiano's "An egalitarian argument for a human right to democracy" approach the issue from a philosophical standpoint. Charlesworth argues that international law has endorsed an essential institutional account of democracy that is limited to participation in an electoral competition. International law does not include any substantive commitments to equality. International instruments do present human rights and democracy as closely related, but there is much wariness about the idea of a right to democracy. Charlesworth thinks this is all for the better since if there were a human right to democracy in international law, it would likely be reduced to a checklist of institutional measures. But having such a checklist in place would do little to help with the real work needed to bring about any genuine form of democracy. What is needed to that effect is an encouragement of debate, discussion and experimentation among citizens.

Gould and Christiano both champion a human right to democracy. Gould seems to think such a right pretty much follows from the fact that human beings are constantly and necessarily engaged in collective agency, and that within their joint projects any kind of domination ought to be avoided. Christiano's argument points out that international politics is a process of negotiated agreements among countries. The leadership of non-democratic regimes has a disproportionate and by definition not democratically validated impact on world politics. Citizens of democratic countries would become complicit with this unjustified state of affairs if they just accepted this status quo. For these reasons arguments for democracy cannot be made one state at a time. Christiano insists that once we are committed to democracy in our own country we must also be committed to it in all the other countries that are linked to us through the negotiated agreements that are at the core of the global order.

The discussion about whether there is a human right to democracy has become rather sophisticated, as captured especially by Christiano's essay. I will here only make one comment on this discussion. If indeed the case for a human right to democracy succeeds, this could show merely that in ideal theory there is such a right. But this would be the kind of ideal-theory case that has basically no bearing on the non-ideal world in which we find ourselves at this stage in history. This also means that a human right to democracy will have little bearing on actual political debate. For instance, it would not be helpful to appeal to it under many of the typical circumstances that prevent the emergence of democracy. In particular, if there are substantial concerns that the racial or ethnic constellation in a country would, under the political conditions that one could reasonably expect to obtain, lead to a kind of excessively populist politics that might generate or exacerbate violent conflict, the sheer fact that there is a human right to democracy should not be decisive for anything. Here I believe the main point made by Charlesworth bears repeating: democracy needs to grow from within, by debate, discussion and experimentation among the citizens.

Part VI has the heading of "What Are the Limits of Rights Enforcement?" Julie Mertus's essay "Is it ever reasonable for one state to invade another for humanitarian reasons? The 'declaratory tradition' and the UN Charter" answers affirmatively the question in the first half of the title. Parts of her article are devoted to surveying the current debate about humanitarian intervention. At the same time, this article is also embedded in a discussion of what she calls the "declaratory tradition" of international law (also mentioned in the title). Unfortunately, even after going over Mertus's essay a few times I have not obtained enough of a grasp of this tradition to report on its contents here. This is one of the articles in this volume that are not trying sufficiently hard to reach an audience that is not yet familiar with the subject area. The same is unfortunately true of another article in this part of the book, Marysia Zalewski's "Searching for the hard questions about women's human rights." For one thing, it never becomes clear why the topic of women's rights as human rights would be put under the heading of rights enforcement. But what is more, the contents of this article have remained mysterious to me. Also, any hope for support from the the editors' executive summary did not materialize. Frankly, I wonder whether the editors themselves had a decent grasp of what this article was trying to do. Consequently, I find myself unable to say anything other than that it would have been splendid if the author and the editors had tried harder to make it intelligible to the interested reader.

Larry May's article "Conflicting responsibilities to protect human rights" is the highlight of this part of the book. May points out that as we make decisions on humanitarian interventions we must also consider that the actual intervening will have to be done by soldiers. The human rights of these soldiers must matter for any decision to intervene. In fact, since any given state has a somewhat more demanding responsibility to look after the protection of the human rights of its own citizens than of the human rights of people in states that might become targets for humanitarian intervention, the human rights of intervening soldiers should matter quite substantially in the deliberation about justified interventions. States may find themselves with genuinely conflicting obligations as they try to determine whether to get involved in a humanitarian intervention. May offers us a careful assessment of the considerations that matter in such a context.

Finally, part VII addresses the question "Are human rights progressive?" Allen Buchanan's "Moral progress and human rights" answers the question affirmatively, expressing a fair amount of genuine enthusiasm for the kind of moral progress human rights have made possible. Buchanan's main criterion for moral progress is formulated in terms of the increasing expansion of the scope of those who justifiably are in the domain of moral consideration. The human rights movement, Buchanan argues, has done very much on this score. One important example he offers is the rights of the handicapped, which received a substantial boost through the increasing recognition of human rights. The human rights movement has also triggered a rethinking of the distinction between duties of justice and duties of charity. Human rights render more things obligatory as a matter of justice than this traditional distinction had conceived. The presence of international institutions makes it possible to come up with a plausible scheme of assigning the corresponding obligations.

Mark Goodale's article "Human rights and moral agency" approaches the question of moral progress from a rather different angle. He admits to finding it rather hard to think about that question, and his main point is that the idea of progressiveness is already tautologically included in the idea of human rights so that the question does not seem to make much sense. To me this is a rather misguided starting point since I fail to see how the idea of moral progress could possibly be so included in the idea of human rights. As Buchanan's article shows, there remains room for formulating a reasonably independent understanding of what moral progress amounts to with regard to which it becomes a genuine question whether human rights contribute to it. Goodale then moves to explore a question that makes more sense to him and with which he basically replaces the question about progress, namely, how the idea of human rights has transformed agency on the ground around the world. This takes us to the rather intriguing literature on human rights locations or vernacularization that has been produced by some anthropologists in recent years, most notably Sally Engle Merry and Goodale himself. That line of inquiry is concerned with how the idea of human rights has transformed local political agency in different parts of the world, agency that traditionally had often not been concerned with human rights. That line of work is tremendously important, and Goodale offers an insightful treatment of that topic.

Laura Parisi's article "Gender mainstreaming human rights: a progressive path for gender equality?" completes this part and thereby the volume. I am afraid I have to say that this article too is among those that do not try very hard to reach an audience that is not normally accustomed to reading about its topic.

Let me conclude by reiterating that I think this volume is a highly useful addition to the literature on human rights. I have learned much from reading (most of) these articles, and I can see myself using some of them in my classes. I am confident that other readers will benefit in the same manner.