Hume: An Intellectual Biography

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James A. Harris, Hume: An Intellectual Biography, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 621pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521837255.

Reviewed by Paul Russell, University of British Columbia/University of Gothenburg


James A. Harris's biography of David Hume is the first such study to appear since Ernest Mossner's The Life of David Hume (1954). Unlike Mossner, Harris aims to write a specifically "intellectual biography", one that gives "a complete picture of Hume's ideas" and "relates Hume's works to the circumstances in which they were conceived and written" (vii). Harris's study turns on four central theses or claims about the character of Hume's thought and how it is structured and developed. The claims are:

  1. Hume's Treatise has no claim to any sort of "privileged" status in relation to Hume's other major works -- which include his Essays and his History of England.
  2. There is no system, doctrine, or fundamental aims or ambitions that serve to unify Hume's thought.
  3. Irreligious aims and interests are not of any particular or unique importance for Hume's thought. Moreover, whatever irreligious aims and objectives Hume may have had, they reflect his moderate, neutral and detached attitude to this and all other subjects -- there is no underlying animus or hostility against religion that motivates his contributions to this subject.
  4. Hume's thought should be understood and explained not in terms of his concern with some specific subject matter or body of doctrine but rather in terms of his style and his identity as a "philosophical man of letters".

The general picture of Hume that emerges from this study, as constructed around these four core theses, is, as I will explain, incomplete, unconvincing and, in important respects, seriously flawed and misleading.


In his Introduction Harris claims that there is a deeply entrenched and persisting consensus within Hume scholarship that the philosophy of the Treatise deserves a "privileged" position with respect to our understanding of Hume's thought and the way it has developed (13). Harris aims to persuade us that if we hold the view that the Treatise is Hume's "greatest work", or simply a particularly important work, then we will inevitably slide into the implausible view that the Treatise is Hume's only important work and, in consequence of this, neglect or diminish the significance of Hume's later works (8-14). This is a troubling start for this study, since there is no reason at all to accept the faulty inference involved. Clearly it is entirely possible to acknowledge the particular importance and significance of Hume's Treatise without denying the importance and significance of Hume's other works (or claiming that the Treatise is Hume's only important work).[1]

The view that the Treatise should be accorded some privileged status is, Harris maintains, closely linked with the suggestion that we can identify or uncover some sort of underlying unity or system in Hume's works (vii, 12-14, 24-25). Harris argues that if there was any such unity to be discovered in Hume's thought, and it had its roots and basis in the Treatise, then it would be impossible to explain how Hume could have introduced any "new ideas" in his later works or how he might have changed or altered his ideas over time (12, 476n61). This argument is similarly confused and unconvincing. There is no reason to suppose that because a thinker is committed or devoted to a particular aim or ambition of some kind that he must be locked into some fixed, rigid set of ideas or arguments. The suggestion that there is some identifiable form of unity or system in Hume's thought in no way implies or commits us to the view that Hume's interests, ideas and arguments did not evolve and change over time. Harris's worry that views of this kind are "harmful to serious thought about Hume's intellectual development" or pose a "danger" to any proper appreciation of his later works (9,13) is not just exaggerated, it is spurious and fabricated and generated by his confused analysis of what such views imply and are committed to.


It is particularly ironic, given Harris's aim to deflate the "privileged" status of the Treatise, that his account of Hume's thought and its development depends entirely on the credibility of his own general interpretation of the Treatise. That is to say, since Harris's deflationary aim is to show that the Treatise does not merit any "privileged" position among Hume's other works, and is not related or connected to them in any way that might justify such special status, this must be argued for on the basis of a detailed, careful analysis of the central aims and arguments of the Treatise. Failing this, Harris's claims would be a matter of mere assertion, rather than grounded on any secure or firm foundation. It is disappointing, therefore, to find that Harris's account of the Treatise is highly compressed and schematic -- moving very rapidly through a series of brief synopses covering the dense, difficult material of this long and complex work. Moreover, much of what Harris has to say about the three Books of the Treatise is generally familiar. He presents Hume as a moderate skeptic whose "main constructive project" in Book I was to offer a "new theory of rationality" (94; but cp. 101); whose "overriding ambition" in Book II was to offer a taxonomy of the passions (111; and cp. 294-5); and, finally, in Book III, was principally concerned with the question of whether or not morality was "natural" or the result of custom and education (120-1). In describing the origins and genesis of Hume's concerns in the Treatise, Harris places heavy emphasis on the influence of Shaftesbury, Mandeville and Hutcheson -- all moralists. He gives little weight to the influence of metaphysicians and epistemologists of this period, such as Malebranche, Locke, Samuel Clarke and Berkeley, all of whom he treats relatively lightly. Harris reviews the various particular topics and issues raised in the Treatise in a breezy and somewhat cavalier manner, often advancing controversial interpretive claims and conjectures that are provided with little or no detailed support. Many of his summary accounts are too slight and thin to even flag the difficulties involved in their analysis or what their deeper significance might be in relation to the overall argument of the Treatise. Taken as a whole, the account given of the Treatise is both incomplete and unconvincing.

A brief review cannot cover all the gaps and problematic assertions that arise in Chapter 2, which Harris devotes to the Treatise. For our present purposes, I will focus attention and scrutiny on two important and related dimensions of the Treatise which are indicative of some of the more serious shortcomings of Harris’s study. The first concerns the "plan" and structure of the Treatise and which work or works, if any, it may have been modelled after. Obviously this is an issue that is directly relevant to Harris's sceptical, deflationary claims about the unity of Hume's thought and the relative importance of the Treatise in relation to his later works. This is an issue that needs to be treated in a careful and convincing manner if Harris is to be in any secure position to support and sustain his strong, sweeping, deflationary claims. When he comes to explain the plan of the Treatise Harris focuses his attention not on the plan that Hume actually executed and completed but on Hume's remarks in his Advertisement to the first Book. In this context Hume remarks that "the subjects of the understanding and the passions make a complete chain of reasoning by themselves", as reflected in Books I and II, published together in 1739. Hume also states that he hopes to "proceed to the examination of morals, politics, and criticism; which will complete this Treatise of human nature." Harris suggests that this project was never completed since "The treatments of politics and criticism never appeared" (81). Later on Harris contorts Hume's remarks into the claim that Hume projected five different Books for the Treatise and that "Book IV on criticism" and "Book V on politics" never appeared (141-2). There is, however, no basis, in the cited Advertisement, for this claim. Harris's talk of Books IV and V is a matter of sheer confabulation -- something which undermines confidence in his judgment and reliability when dealing with issues of this kind.

What we do know is that in Book III, "Of Morals", Hume covers politics as well as morals but does not discuss criticism -- this part of his design was dropped. The plan we are actually presented with is, nevertheless, clear enough. We have, moreover, Hume's more interesting and relevant remarks in the Abstract concerning the plan of the Treatise. In this context Hume remarks that the Treatise "seems to be written upon the same plan with several other works that have had great vogue of late years in England" (AB, 1). Since Harris does not cite or discuss these opening remarks of the Abstract, he offers his readers no suggestions about what this plan might be or which works Hume has specifically in mind. What Harris does acknowledge, however, is that Hobbes published "a book on human nature the structure of which is strikingly similar to the Treatise" (83). The significance of this is much greater than Harris's passing comment suggests. The relevant structure of this project appears in both Hobbes's The Elements of Law and the first two parts of his Leviathan -- the latter being a hugely important work that cast a long shadow of influence well into the 18th century. When Hobbes's Elements was first published in 1650 it appeared in the form of two works, Human Nature and De Corpore Politico. In the latter work Hobbes's refers to the former in more than one context as his "treatise of Human Nature". Hume's Treatise has, therefore, both a Hobbist plan and a Hobbist title. All this is, of course, of considerable importance and relevance when assessing the significance of Hume's "plan" but Harris mentions none of it.

The deeper and further significance of Hume's Hobbist plan can be better appreciated when it is considered in relation to the title-pages of the Treatise, a matter which Harris also treats in an incomplete and unsatisfactory manner. Although he discusses Hume's title-pages in a separate context from his discussion of the plan of the Treatise, they are intimately related. The title-pages of the Treatise Books I and II contain an epigram from Tacitus that has considerable significance. The epigram not only raises the issue of freedom of thought and expression but also was used by Spinoza for the title of the last chapter of his Tractatus Theologico-Politicus, a work that was especially influential among radical freethinkers in the early 18th century context. Hume's use of this epigram clearly flagged what one early reviewer (in the German journal Neuen Zeitungen) described as his "evil intentions" and marked him out as a "new freethinker". The epigram that appeared on the title-page of Book III is also of related significance. It is taken from Lucan's Pharsalia and introduces a long speech by Cato that contains a series of irreligious themes and doctrines. The speech by Cato appears prominently in Anthony Collins's Discourse of Freethinking (1713) -- another important work that had enormous impact at this time. Hume's use of the epigrams on his title-pages is a clear and obvious example of the practice of esoteric communication -- a mode of presenting dangerous ideas that was familiar to freethinkers in the early 18th century context (and recommended by, among others, Shaftesbury). None of this is explored or even mentioned by Harris. Nor does he explain the general freethinking significance of the epigrams or the way in which they are intimately related to Hume's Hobbist plan and title. The significance of all this should, however, have been obvious to Harris as, apart from anything else, he makes some (brief and passing) reference to Hobbes and Spinoza and their shared reputations as leading representatives of modern "atheism" (53, 63, 66). In sum, Harris not only omits key points of evidence and interest in relation to these matters, he fails to link and relate the evidence that he does cite in a manner that brings to light the deep and systematic freethinking, irreligious features of Hume's Treatise.

We encounter a second set of omissions and distortions in Harris's study as it concerns the relevance of Clarke for Hume's philosophy. Clarke was, of course, a towering figure of early 18th century British philosophy and he surfaces in various specific contexts relevant to Hume's philosophy -- particularly as it concerns the Treatise. Clarke's reputation not only rested on his association with Newton and his defence of the Newtonian philosophy in the celebrated correspondence with Leibniz (1717), but also was founded upon his hugely influential Boyle Lectures, which were published in 1705 as a Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God. In the Demonstration Clarke seeks to refute the atheistic philosophy of Hobbes, Spinoza and their followers and advances a powerful set of arguments, employing demonstrative reason, to prove the existence and attributes of God, along with other key doctrines that he judged essential to the Christian religion, such as the immortality of the soul and free will. Clarke's philosophy plays a crucial role in at least three related but distinct domains that are all essential for a proper understanding of Hume's philosophy in the Treatise.

The first of these concerns the significant and substantial set of debates and controversies that took place in the Borders of Scotland in the late 1720s and early 1730s, where Hume was residing when the Treatise first began to take shape. One of the most important figures in this context is Andrew Baxter. Harris treats Baxter as a marginal and peripheral figure -- someone whose writings Hume "might have been aware of" (68). Contrary to the impression Harris gives, Baxter was a very important figure in this context and was generally regarded by his own contemporaries as the most distinguished and prominent representative and defender of the Clarkean philosophy, which includes not only the argument a priori but also other important doctrines, such as the immortality of the soul and free will. Among other significant details relating to Baxter that Harris omits are that Baxter "abhorred the early work of Mr. Hume" and that one of Baxter's closest friends and greatest admirers was William Warburton, Hume's lifelong nemesis and arch critic. It would be obvious to both Hume and his contemporaries, as it was to Baxter, that the core content of the Treatise stands in direct and systematic opposition to all that Baxter argues for (as per the Clarkean philosophy).

Another context where the importance of Clarke's philosophy surfaces is in the early reviews of the Treatise. The two most substantial of these pay particular attention to Hume's criticism of the argument a priori, as advanced by both Locke and Clarke. These early reviews also allude to the affinities between Hume's philosophy and the views of Hobbes, Spinoza and other "freethinkers" and "minute philosophers". One of the most egregious gaps in Harris's study is that he says little or nothing about these early reviews (Harris, 118; cp. Mossner, Chap. 10, who discusses them in some detail). A third domain in which Clarke's philosophy plays a prominent role concerns Hume's unsuccessful application for the Chair of Philosophy at Edinburgh University in 1744-45. The key document dealing with these events is the Letter from a Gentleman (1745), which also contains various "charges" levelled against Hume by a critic. In dealing with this material Harris presents several loose and unconvincing speculations about the motivations of Hume's critic. He does not, however, draw the most obvious inference, which is that Hume's critic, who Harris identifies as William Wishart, was an admirer and adherent of the Clarkean philosophy and (correctly) recognized that Hume's philosophy is directly opposed to Clarke's doctrine and principles and that it aims to advance freethinking and atheistic doctrines instead. Harris also fails to mention that Wishart was a subscriber to Baxter's Enquiry in 1733 and that one of Wishart's key allies in the machinations against Hume's candidacy was Gavin Hamilton, who published Baxter's Enquiry in 1733. These individuals were particularly well placed to appreciate the irreligious significance of Hume's philosophy and how it stood in relation to both the battle against the atheism of Hobbes and Spinoza and, more specifically, its obvious relevance to the heated and acrimonious debates relating to Clarke's philosophy in Scotland at this time. Most, if not all of this, is lost on Harris's account. This level of neglect does much to explain why Harris fails to locate Hume's work in its most significant context -- the Radical Enlightenment -- and also accounts for Harris's related failure to identify the multiple layers and dimensions of irreligious themes and aims that are advanced in the Treatise.


When Harris goes on to discuss Hume's "recasting" of Book I in the form of the first Enquiry (i.e. the Philosophical Essays concerning Human Understanding, 1748) it becomes clear how detached he is from the main fabric of both the texts and contexts involved. As I have explained, Harris not only seeks to deflate the importance of the Treatise in relation to Hume's thought taken as a whole (i.e. qua his doubts about the privileged view), he also aims to deflate the importance and salience of irreligion for Hume's thought in general and for the Treatise in particular. In pressing this theme Harris endorses the familiar view that Hume "castrated" the Treatise and removed much of its irreligious content (117). Harris pairs this with the matching claim that issues relating to "the rational justification of religious belief are much more prominent" in the first Enquiry (199). Although this view of the relationship between the Treatise and the first Enquiry has been long and widely held it is, nevertheless, thoroughly mistaken. Harris's account adds to the confusion and errors involved. He suggests, for example, that Hume's Letter in 1745 suggests that the argument a priori "has fallen into disrepute" (213). It is not true that Hume suggests this, any more than it is true that the argument a priori had fallen into disrepute. Why would Hume (or Harris) claim this in a context where Hume's critics and accusers plainly regard the argument to be both important and convincing? Why would Hume make a claim of this kind when he went on to write the Dialogues, where he devotes an entire section (Dialogues, 9) to the refutation of the argument a priori? It is also misleading to suggest that in the first Enquiry Hume dropped his skeptical critique of the argument a priori (Harris, 212, 225-6; cp. 65-6, 82, 450). In the Enquiry, no less than in the Treatise, Hume makes clear that "if we reason a priori, anything may appear able to produce anything" and that "divinity or school metaphysics" that aim to demonstrate the existence of any object (i.e. God) "can contain nothing but sophistry and illusion" (EU, 12. 29-34). Contrary to what Harris supposes, the first Enquiry is loaded with arguments that serve to discredit the argument a priori, not just the argument a posteriori. This is something that should be obvious to any one with a sure or firm grasp of the core arguments involved.

Although Harris cites, in fragments, Hume's remarks at the end of the first Enquiry, he denies that these remarks, or any other remarks of a similar kind, are indicative either of any fundamental or systematic irreligious concerns in this work or that they reveal any particular hostility or animus towards religion or religious philosophy in general. With regard to the first issue, Harris suggests that Hume wrote the first Enquiry as a way of repackaging the contents of Book I of the Treatise in the manner of an "essayist" (221) and that Hume's central motivations and aims in this work concern his account of probabilistic reasoning (223; cp. 92-4, 101, 119). What makes the Enquiry account different, Harris suggests, is not only the manner of delivery (qua "essayist") but that in this work Hume also draws out the religious implications of his account of probable reasoning (223). According to Harris however, irreligious themes are not Hume's exclusive or his primary concern in the Enquiry, any more than they were in the Treatise. It should be evident, however, that if the irreligious interpretation of the Treatise is correct and accurate, then Harris's view of Hume's aims and argument in the first Enquiry are also misguided and mistaken. The fundamental aim of Hume's set of sceptical arguments relating to the limits of human understanding with respect to both demonstrative and probable reasoning is to discredit the whole edifice of Christian theological speculation and metaphysics -- just as Hume's (sharp) concluding remarks to the first Enquiry plainly suggest. Harris has absorbed little or none of this.

When we turn to the various irreligious themes and concerns that Harris does manage to identify and consider, Hume's attitude with regard to religion is presented as one of consistent "moderation", "impartiality" and "detachment", and as lacking any practical aims or agenda of a specifically irreligious nature (see, e.g., 19, 22-3, 205, 227, 297, 343-5, 414, 416, 456). This is a recurrent theme -- if not a dominant theme -- that runs throughout Harris's study. It is of a piece with his general picture of Hume, outlined in his Introduction, as a "philosophical man of letters", whose primary identity rests with his style rather than any particular doctrine or subject matter (viii, 2, 15, 18, 24-5). According to this view, Hume approached all issues and topics, including religion, with a detached and disinterested attitude that excludes any form of passion or practical aspirations or ambitions of any kind. It excludes, more specifically, any picture of Hume as being aggressively, consistently, and assertively hostile towards religion -- as this would be entirely at odds with the distant and anodyne picture that Harris wants to draw. The difficulty that he faces, throughout his study, is that there is a mountain of recalcitrant evidence, relating to both Hume's texts and context, that tell against this rather drab and insipid view of Hume's character and thought. Although Harris avoids mentioning, much less reviewing, much of this evidence he still has to engage with any number of passages and episodes that tell against it.

One contribution that disturbs Harris's general easy confidence on this subject is Hume's famously harsh and hostile remarks about the clergy in his essay "Of National Characters". These remarks are plainly directly at odds with Harris's preferred picture of Hume as a friend of the "Moderate" clergy who considers all problems and topics of religion in a detached manner and with little or no agitation or animus.[2] Harris is, therefore, rightly puzzled by Hume's "outburst of spleen" (244-5). The more fundamental problem for Harris is that this is by no means an isolated example -- as many other strongly worded, hostile "outbursts" can be found. This is especially true with regard to matters of religion, where Hume's language is frequently anything but detached and moderate and veers heavily in the direction of ridicule, sarcasm and, occasionally, invective. Examples of this can be found within Harris's own work (see, e.g. 292, where he cites Hume's notorious "sick men's dreams" passage in the Natural History of Religion; and also 301 and 420 where he cites Hume's sharp and severe remarks about Warburton and Rousseau). Contrary to the simplified and distorted picture that Harris tries to force upon his readers, Hume was a complex character with complex and variable motivations and attitudes. Although he was, as the more sentimental and overdrawn picture of "le bon David" would suggest, temperamentally moderate and measured in his modes of expression and his dealings with others, Hume was in no way reluctant to bite hard when an appropriate and deserving target came his way.[3] This is especially true when it comes to his dealings with religious bigots of various kinds and it is also true of his philosophical writings as they concern matters of religion in all its familiar forms (and not just in the local form of orthodox Calvinism, as Harris would like to persuade us). In general, it is a mistake to try and defang as well as deflate Hume's attitude towards religion -- there is simply too much weighty evidence against it.


It should be clear, in light of the above, that Harris's study is deeply flawed in respect of its central claims about the structure, content, and development of Hume's thought. It is also incomplete and unreliable in respect of many of the important details as they concern these matters. It has, nevertheless, some redeeming features. Consistent with his deflationary views concerning the relative importance of the Treatise and Hume's philosophy, Harris devotes a considerable amount of attention and space to Hume's Essays and his History of England (e.g., two full chapters on the History -- more than 100 pages or nearly a quarter of the whole book). Harris's commentary is lucid and occasionally illuminating in relation to these works -- he is at his best here. Although we may all agree that these other works are also of some interest and importance, I doubt that Harris's extended discussion and examination of the Essays and History will persuade many that we should join him in rejecting the privileged view or throw weight back onto the contributions of the Essays and History. On the contrary, interesting and worthwhile as Harris's commentary may be, in places, these works receive an excessive amount of attention and emphasis in relation to Hume's overall contribution and achievements. A more balanced intellectual biography would, for example, have much more to say about the Dialogues, which receive slight and superficial treatment in comparison with both the Essays and the History (444-56). Finally, although this study is dense with details and facts -- sometimes too many, sometimes too few, and sometimes unreliable -- it is still readable and clearly presented. Nevertheless, taken as a whole, these merits do not compensate for the more serious failings and flaws.

Contrary to the portrait Harris paints, although Hume certainly cared about his style, and may well have regarded himself as a "philosophical man of letters", he cared about much more than this. He was, in particular, deeply and systematically concerned with issues and problems of religion -- especially as they concern the corruption of both philosophy and morality. These themes and issues inform much of what motivates and directs Hume's thought. They constitute, moreover, the strong, sturdy spine of Hume's thought and his intellectual achievement. The whole body of Hume's thought, like the Treatise itself, is to a considerable extent shaped, animated and directed by these core concerns and issues. Harris's study systematically obscures and distorts these features of Hume's fundamental motivation and thought and, as such, to use Harris's own language, does "harm" and poses a real "danger" to our understanding and appreciation of Hume's life, work, and achievement.


Mossner, E.C. (1980). The Life of David Hume. 2nd ed. Clarendon Press.

[1] It is worth considering this debate about whether Hume's Treatise was just "great", or "one of the greatest", or "the greatest" of Hume's works with reference to Hume's own remarks in the Dialogues (12.7) concerning "merely verbal" controversies in philosophical and theological enquiries.

[2] Further evidence of Harris's lack of balance in relation to these matters may be found in his account of Hume's various friendships. Harris in various places emphasizes that Hume was on friendly terms with members of the moderate clergy in Scotland, some of who were among his closest friends (22, 298-99, 499n94). In contrast with this, Harris suggests that there was "little genuine intellectual affinity between Hume and the philosophes" and that Hume had little sympathy with their more "radical" attitudes about religion (414, 439). This way of contrasting Hume's respective relations with his friends among the moderate clergy in Scotland and the philosophes in France is misleading and oversimplified. A more balanced assessment would say that Hume enjoyed close friendships (in various degrees) with members from both groups and that he also had disagreements with both about matters of religion and philosophy. The crucial point is that one thing Hume certainly shared with the philosophes was that he was highly critical of religion -- even if he did not endorse their dogmatic attitudes and stance.

[3] In a number of respects Harris's general view of Hume's character and philosophical orientation is similar or close to that of Mossner -- especially the picture of Hume as "le bon David", a moderate philosophical skeptic, with a mild, gentle manner and disposition. Although Harris is critical of Mossner's biography (ix, 474-5n48, 480n102) there is, generally speaking, much less distance between their accounts than Harris's remarks would seem to suggest.