Hume, Passion, and Action

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Elizabeth S. Radcliffe, Hume, Passion, and Action, Oxford University Press, 2018, 230pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199573295.

Reviewed by Simon Blackburn, Trinity College, Cambridge


For many years philosophy that is focused on ethics, or action, or human desire, or just human nature in general, has revolved around something called the Humean Theory of Motivation. The theory has been roundly attacked, passionately defended, and occasionally dismissed as a mere tautology, not a theory at all. In the dust raised by all this controversy it has not always been easy to be sure exactly what the theory was supposed to be, and in particular what it was supposed to be by its eponymous author, David Hume himself. Philosophers have, of course, pored over the texts, and scholars have done much to put them in the context of seventeenth and eighteenth century thought. Elizabeth Radcliffe's bibliography gives eight pages (approaching 200 papers and books) of recent discussions, mostly following on from Páll Årdal's groundbreaking 1966 book, Passion and Value in Hume's Treatise. But in spite of the superficial clarity of Hume's writing and the valuable labours of so many scholars, the details of his own views have proved surprisingly elusive. Radcliffe's book is not only an excellent guide to the twists and turns that these discussions have taken, but a beautifully judged, balanced, and therefore especially valuable addition to the literature.

Hume's writings on these matters deploy a great many categories and concepts. When we enter Book II of the Treatise, we rapidly encounter denizens of our minds beyond the impressions and ideas of Book I, such as passions (direct, indirect, violent, strong, or calm), motivations, desires, aversions, propensities, pleasures, pains and the prospect of them, exercises of imagination, beliefs and sensations. We also soon find complexities, such as the double relation of impressions and ideas, or whether things are original existences or contain any representative quality, or bear reference to other things. Later, at the beginning of Book III we find these distinctions working to show that morality has nothing much to do with reason. It can seem a sweeping, surprising, and to some writers a detestable conclusion to come out of the psychological thickets, so it is little wonder the machine built in Book II comes in for so much ferocious inspection. Moral rationalists and realists, frightened by the Humean juggernaut, would like nothing more than to throw a spanner in its works.

Fortunately, they will not find an ally in Elizabeth Radcliffe. Obeying the excellent motto that you cannot be said to understand writers unless you find the most charitable interpretation of their words, she infuses her very real skills at negotiating the complexities with a fine eye for the truth, and the significance of Hume's general architecture. In a brief review I can do little more than list some of the many things that she gets right. She bats out of the park the canard that Hume is unaware of, or denying, the intentionality of emotion when he says that a passion 'contains not any representative quality'. She defends the view that it takes something beyond the pure deliverances of reason to engage the passions and points out forcefully that this was a view that was common to many writers before Hume, including not only Descartes, Locke and Spinoza, but even the paradigm rationalists such as Clarke and Cudworth. Hume's originality lay more in arguing that since the pure deliverances of reason must rely on inclinations and propensities in order to give rise to passions, so they must do in order to control them. It is because of this that we should turn our back on the "combat" between reason and passion. She makes plentiful room for the reality of self-control, whereby well-directed imagination, giving us prospects of pleasure and pain, engages with some passions in order to help us to control others, although Hume had an entirely realistic sense of the intransigence of human nature, and its susceptibility to the temptations provided by proximity in time and place. She is modest about taking sides in debates such as those surrounding the alleged change between the Treatise and the Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, whereby the sentiment of sympathy coupled with the general or common point of view in the first is either merely redescribed or significantly transformed into a concern for the common good and an indirect utilitarianism in the second.

She is right as well that it is anachronistic to claim Hume outright for one or another of the camps wedded to particular semantic theses that provide the currency of so much analytic philosophy. Instead she contents herself with denying that Hume is committed to a non-cognitivist theory. I agree, and we need look no further than the first page of the Enquiry in order to find Hume dismissing any sceptic who "denies the reality of moral distinctions". So the label "non-cognitivism" certainly jars -- but then it also jars on expressivists such as myself. I think that Radcliffe's scholarly reticence here is absolutely appropriate, but I also think that it does fall to us, if we take ourselves to have developed some command of semantic idioms, to ask how best to fit the abundant insights and developments of the Scottish sentimentalist tradition (not only in Hume but also in Adam Smith) into our current categories. Hume's philosophy concerns human nature in a natural world, so our moral natures cannot be matters of cognizing the instructions of the universe, or of God, or of reason. They only show us somewhat inclined to follow our better sentiments and abide by whatever cooperative constructions and conventions have grown around us. There may well be some latitude, but I would say not too much, in how we keep hold of that remarkable illumination if we want to put it in terms of cognition, truth, reference or even reason. There are better and worse ways of doing this, and, of course, I think that expressivism provides the former, but I applaud Radcliffe's tact in keeping herself apart from those issues.

However, as an aside I would say that similar problems bedevil the way we think of Hume's theory of causation, and if we follow Norman Kemp Smith in holding that there is a close relationship between Hume's treatment of morality and his treatment of causation, that is not surprising. In this latter case, it is clear that we have no awareness of any necessary connection between distinct events, but it is also clear that natural propensities of the mind fill any gap this might be supposed to leave. Again, it must be right to say that those dispositions are on show, or expressed, when we enter causal interpretations of events, and again this is a thoroughly good thing. It is not the projection of any kind of error, but the comforting scaffolding of certainty that enables human life to go forward. Once more, though, it is not entirely easy to put Hume's insight into a semantic idiom; but here Hume's own insouciance about the "two definitions" of cause, tossed off as unimportant asides at the end of his discussions, reminds us that if we allow ourselves to get upset about that, it may be our problem, not his.

Reading Radcliffe's book is an excellent reminder of how far the history of philosophy has matured in the last fifty years. It is also an object lesson in the philosophical value of such study. As with evolution, later does not always mean better, and few moral philosophers or moral psychologists can afford to ignore the riches work such as hers unveils. For scholars of Hume, and of his seventeenth and eighteenth century context, it will be indispensable.