Hume's A Treatise of Human Nature, An Introduction

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John P. Wright, Hume's A Treatise of Human Nature, An Introduction, Cambridge University Press, 2009, 336pp., $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 978052154589.

Reviewed by Charlotte R. Brown and William Edward Morris, Illinois Wesleyan University


This book is a recent addition to Cambridge's "Introductions to Key Philosophical Texts" series, which offers "introductory textbooks" on philosophical classics. Each book is supposed to "guide readers through the main arguments" of the philosophical text in question, while "dealing with issues of interpretation." They are also supposed to provide some insight into the relevant philosophical context within which the book was written as well as an appreciation of its reception. Volumes in this series assume "no philosophical background knowledge" and should "be suited to introductory university-level courses."

Wright is aware of his charge, and his book has several attractive features that should make it a suitable introduction to the Treatise. He subdivides each chapter into manageable chunks and provides easy to follow subheadings ("Hume's Conception of Philosophy and Its Methods," "Moral Sense in Hutcheson's Philosophy") designed to cue students to the topic currently under discussion. He also follows authors like Norman Kemp Smith and Annette Baier in attempting to provide a unified reading of the Treatise as a whole.

Wright thinks the Treatise poses a special problem for fledgling readers. Given that there are many rival interpretations of it, do you explain and compare all of them, or do you provide only one reading? Wright thinks both options are unacceptable. The former runs the risk of making it appear that the Treatise is so unclear that, as Hume's late nineteenth-century editor L. A. Selby-Bigge said, "all philosophies may be found in it, or none at all," while the latter tack invites "oversimplifying" Hume's arguments. Wright's solution is to take a "middle course," one that provides a unified reading of the Treatise while showing how it differs from other interpretations.

But Wright is also a man with a mission, and that mission determines the "middle course" he charts through the Treatise. He has been a prime mover in "the 'new Hume' debate" -- the controversy over whether Hume is a skeptical realist, that is, whether he was both a realist, committed to a world independent of our perceptions, and a skeptic, believing there is precious little our limited understandings can grasp of its nature. Wright's earlier book, The Skeptical Realism of David Hume (1983), leaned heavily on his reading of key passages in An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding to make his case. His mission here is to show that Hume is a skeptical realist throughout the three books of the Treatise. He bolsters his reading by examining how Hume's views relate to those of his predecessors.

After a lengthy discussion in Chapter 1 of Hume's intellectual development and the scholarly controversies surrounding it, Wright describes Hume's science of human nature and its basic machinery in Chapter 2, "First Principles." His Hume doesn't aspire to be the Newton of the moral sciences, but is firmly rooted in Cartesian science and philosophy and in the British tradition of experimental natural philosophy exemplified by Boyle. For Wright, the Cartesian tradition and the prevailing eighteenth-century mechanical account of the imagination represented in Chambers' Cyclopedia provide Hume with a hypothesis about the association of ideas that he uses to explain the Copy Principle and the transfer of force and vivacity from impressions to ideas.

Wright maintains that Hume's account of the origin of our ideas plays an important skeptical role. His "central goal is to show the limits of what we can legitimately believe on the basis of those ideas, and to postulate other processes of the imagination which explain how we construct the reality in which we naturally and inevitably believe" (78). Wright spells out this picture in the next three chapters, which make his core case for reading the Treatise as a skeptical realist tract.

In Chapters 3 ("Causation") and 5 ("Determinism"), Wright argues that Hume's account of our idea of causation and the necessary connection it involves, which are captured in his definitions of cause and necessity, concern only "the epistemological basis of our ascription of causal necessity, not … what we intend to convey when we make such ascriptions" (189). Thus, Hume's definitions aren't "his last word … on the ontology of causation" (81). If we read the definitions as epistemological, they are "signs of a genuine but unintelligible necessity" (170), which Wright thinks also applies to Hume's accounts of liberty and necessity. On his reading, Hume attributes "real ontological necessity" (xii) both to physical events and human wills.

Wright assumes that there are three live options on the ontology of causation: reductionism (or the regularity theory), skeptical realism, and the projectivist or expressivist quasi-realism championed by Blackburn and others. Having already rejected reductionism, he suggests that quasi-realism can't capture Hume's intentions, since Hume gave no account of language as expressive rather than descriptive, but declines to discuss that view in detail. Wright maintains that Hume's explanation of why we suppose there is power or necessity in matter is based on his associationism, not on views about language having more than a descriptive function (213-4). For Wright, this leaves skeptical realism the winner of the ontological sweepstakes.

Supplementing Wright's case is Chapter 4 ("Skepticism"), which deals, often perfunctorily, with the several topics Hume addresses in the final part of Book 1, including skepticism about reason, the senses, material substrata, and personal identity. Discussing skepticism about the senses, Wright defends his earlier attribution to Hume of that staple of scientific -- and thus for Hume, skeptical -- realism, the representative theory of perception, or indirect realism. "Like other philosophers, Hume distinguishes between dependent sensory perceptions and independent external objects… . This is the theory of the 'double existence of perceptions and objects' adopted by philosophers, including Hume himself" (152).

Wright is adamant that Hume holds the theory, despite the fact that Hume himself offers an extended critique of it. But for Wright, this only reinforces the point that Hume's "deepest form of skepticism is cognitive" -- "based on the obscurity of the basic suppositions which we naturally make about reality, including the belief that the objects of our senses continue to exist while unperceived" (xi). Wright argues that skepticism about our cognitive faculties runs throughout Part 4 of Book 1, culminating in the "total skepticism" of 1.4.7. Passions -- curiosity and ambition -- not reason, save us from total skepticism and provide the motivation to pursue science.

These central chapters cover Book 1 and extend the argument into Book 2 with the discussion of liberty and necessity. But beyond that, skeptical realism doesn't figure into Wright's other accounts of Book 2 topics, the passions (Chapter 6) and motivation (Chapter 7). By the time he gets to Book 3, skeptical realism is glaringly absent, and Wright seems ambivalent about whether there are parallels between Humean science and Humean morality, or whether they are essentially different. Moral judgments, like inductive inferences, aren't based on reason, and there is also a gap between what is the case and what ought to be the case, just as there is a parallel gap between past regularities and the future. Psychological mechanisms fill the gap in both cases. For moral judgments, "the gap is filled by a mechanism which projects our sentiments or feelings on to reality" (255), while custom fills the inductive gap.

There the parallels end. There is a "fundamental asymmetry" (253) between causal and moral judgments. Hume's skeptical realism about causation commits him to the view that there is an unknown reality that, had we better mental faculties, could close the gap between past regularities and the future. In the moral case, however, there is no reality "out there" that could, even in principle, fill the gap between is and ought. We project (255) our moral sentiments onto an objective world that is "indifferent" to morality.

Wright not only abandons skeptical realism for the case of morality, but in endorsing the view that we project our moral sentiments onto the world, he also sounds suspiciously like he's adopting the projectivism characteristic of Blackburn's quasi-realism. Whatever the relative merits of these rival positions, Wright has, by his own admission, failed to provide the unified reading of the Treatise he advertised.

Irrespective of how deep a challenge Wright's failure to provide a unified interpretation poses to his skeptical realist reading of the Treatise, it definitely raises questions about the success of his "middle course" strategy as a vehicle for presenting it to students who have been exposed to little or no philosophy and, thus, raises questions about whether he succeeds in meeting the series' aims.

Wright is well versed in the debates Hume entered into and the controversies about his views current among our contemporaries. But his book is so peppered with references to players in both sets of debates that it is unclear whether beginning students will be able to recognize whether the philosophers to whom Wright refers are Hume's contemporaries or ours. Without a chronological scorecard and a systematic account of the debates involved, it's hard for beginning students to locate the players. Is Grotius a contemporary of Galileo -- or Garrett?

Some of Wright's discussions of rival interpretations are too abbreviated for beginners to follow -- for example, his two-paragraph discussion of Schneewind's suggestion of how Hume may escape moral skepticism (252). Others, such as his discussion of Hume's intellectual development (Chapter 1), are too fulsome. Designed to show how recent scholarship on that topic challenges the traditional picture, it is 39 pages long and contains over 100 footnotes. Although undergraduates may be interested in Hume's intellectual development, they probably aren't that interested in scholarly controversies about it.

However, it is important to realize that what makes this book difficult for beginning students is not solely a matter of Wright's chosen strategy. There is something problematic in general about attempting to introduce a complex, subtle, and controversial philosophical classic in its entirety to students with no previous background in philosophy.

Perhaps we shouldn't take Cambridge's stated aims for the series so seriously. Its worthiness as an "introductory textbook" aside, how does Wright's book fare in reading the Hume of the Treatise as a skeptical realist?

Even in the areas where the case for skeptical realism is arguably most plausible, there are problems with Wright's reading. His emphasis on the continuity of Hume's views with those of his predecessors ignores what is radical about his project. While Wright's account of association treats it as continuous with the Cartesian and mechanistic traditions, Hume regards his use of that principle as what entitles him "to so glorious a name as that of an inventor" (Abstract 35/SBN 661). To emphasize the radically innovative character of his experimental science of human nature, he very deliberately associates himself with Newton, likening the "gentle force" of association to that of gravitation, as "a kind of attraction, which in the mental world will be found to have as extraordinary effects as in the natural" (T 1.1.4/SBN 12-3).

Wright also ignores Hume's strategy in introducing the distinction between impressions and ideas, as well as the centrality of his account of definition. In his project for the total reform of philosophy, his account of definition is designed to play both a critical role -- eliminating speculative hypotheses about the "ultimate original principles" of human nature -- and a constructive one -- providing an accurate account of the cognitive content of our ideas.

Hume began the Treatise with an account of impressions and ideas because he believed that any intelligible philosophical question must be asked and answered in those terms. He is deliberately moving away from what he regards as incoherent metaphysics to the only area where a clear understanding of the central concepts of philosophy can be had -- the realm of impressions and ideas. Metaphysics tempts us to think that we can find principles that will show us the ultimate nature of reality. Hume shows us how to resist that temptation. Wright misses this resolutely anti-metaphysical aspect of Hume's project. In doing so, he joins a long line of Hume's readers who take him to share their interest in discussing ultimate metaphysical questions.

All this is evident in Wright's case for skeptical realism about causation. He fails to see that Hume is interested in capturing the cognitive content of our idea of causation in his definitions of cause, not in drawing metaphysical or ontological implications from them. Ironically, then, while Wright is correct to say that Hume's definitions aren't "his last word on the ontology of causation," that is because they aren't his first word, either. Hume isn't playing that game at all.

As far as the skeptical realist debate goes, Hume rejects all three options Wright entertains: reductive regularity, quasi-realism, and skeptical realism. All are positions in the metaphysics of causation, and Hume isn't doing metaphysics.

Wright's insistence on ignoring the anti-metaphysical strain in the Treatise helps explain why he is also so eager to attribute indirect realism to Hume, despite his trenchant dismissal of this "arbitrary," "groundless" system, which he regards as "only a palliative remedy," which both depends on the ordinary person's view and "contains all [its] difficulties, with some others that are peculiar to itself" (T 211). While Hume thinks that we can easily enough determine that the ordinary person's view is incorrect, "the double existence theory," as he calls indirect realism, is actually worse. His own account of our ideas of objects, which he calls "the true philosophy," "approaches nearer to the sentiments of the vulgar, than to those of a mistaken knowledge" (T 222-223) -- that is, closer to the ordinary person's theory than the philosophers' double existence theory.

Given his attribution of indirect realism to Hume, it is not surprising that Wright refuses to acknowledge that Humean impressions are not representative. Were he to grant that "the ultimate cause" of impressions is "perfectly inexplicable by human reason," and that it is "impossible to decide with certainty" how they are derived, "nor is such a question material to our present purposes" (T 84), he would see that regarding impressions as representative opens the door to metaphysics that Hume is trying so hard to close. But without that assumption, neither indirect realism nor skeptical realism has any legitimate claim to be views Hume actually held.