Hume's Epistemology in the Treatise

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Frederick F. Schmitt, Hume's Epistemology in the Treatise: A Veritistic InterpretationOxford University Press, 2014, 423pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199683116.

Reviewed by Kevin Meeker, University of South Alabama


This scholarly and philosophically rich treatment of Hume's epistemology furnishes a clear and comprehensive reading of Hume as a reliabilist about justified belief that is reminiscent of Alvin Goldman's naturalistic epistemology (for an explicit comparison, see especially 30).1 Because Humean justification is understood in terms of reliably attaining the non-instrumental cognitive goal of truth, Frederick F. Schmitt calls this a veritistic interpretation. Given this description, one might worry that Schmitt's discussion is simply an anachronistic attempt to impose contemporary categories on Hume. One need not entertain such worries. Although Schmitt admits that without contemporary work in naturalistic epistemology he "would certainly never have thought of [this] interpretation" (vi), he carefully connects Hume's concepts to contemporary ones and spends a considerable amount of time relating Hume's views to Descartes, Malebranche, Newton and especially Locke. The overarching argument of this book is very long and has many complicated, densely packed, and interlocking parts. Here I will provide a brief overview of the book before discussing some of its strengths and weaknesses.

The book contains four major "divisions", with each division providing a preview, two to four chapters, and summary of the division. Preceding the first division is a crucial chapter detailing the epistemological framework for this study, which places certain constraints on any plausible interpretation of Humean justified belief. It concludes with a useful summary of Schmitt's main theses as well as a general assessment of his interpretive project.

In the first division, Schmitt notes that epistemologists from Plato's time onward have emphatically distinguished between knowledge and probability/belief/opinion. Epistemologists have differed, though, on how to understand causal inferences in terms of this important dichotomy. For Schmitt, although Hume mostly follows Locke's way of drawing the knowledge/probability distinction, Hume also departs from Locke in wresting causal inferences from the domain of knowledge and placing them in the category of probability. To elaborate a bit, Schmitt builds on David Owen's work2 to show how Hume develops an associative mechanism underlying his psychology of casual inferences. According to this picture, causal reasoning "resides" in the imagination. On the face of it, implying that causal inferences are "imaginary" in some sense seems to imply that such inferences are epistemically inferior to demonstrative inferences. According to Schmitt, Hume confronts this problem by arguing that knowledge and proofs produced by causal inferences are both types of justified belief because they are both forms of reliable belief. In the case of knowledge, Schmitt contends more precisely that "for Hume knowledge entails the justifiedness of whatever belief (if any) accompanies the knowledge" (87). To put these points another way, on Schmitt's view both the infallibility of knowledge and the certainty of proofs produced by causal inferences entail what he calls "de facto reliability". So there is no great gap between the epistemic status of knowledge and causal inferences.

Division II argues that Hume's defense of associationism assumes that causal reasoning is (defeasibly) justifying. On the other hand, Hume's defense of the justifying power of causal reasoning does not appeal to his associationism, according to Schmitt. In Division III Schmitt extends an interpretation of Hume's view about external objects begun in the previous division: that beliefs about external objects can be justified only by causal inferences. Because Hume thinks that operations based on identity, instead of causal inferences, generate our belief in the continued and distinct existence of external objects, this belief is not justified.

I have only scratched the surface of Schmitt's argument to this point. But I hope that by now it is clear that the naturalistic, reliabilist epistemology that he attributes to Hume stands in stark contrast to the sceptical reading of Hume, according to which beliefs lack epistemic justification. Philosophers who interpret Hume as a sceptic often point at least in part to the Conclusion of Book I of the Treatise to justify such a reading. According to Schmitt, this "vertiginous" section is "the most challenging fifteen paragraphs in the literature of scepticism, fraught with peril not only for the philosopher who endures these 'desponding reflections', but also for the interpreter who must discern their import" (341). In Division IV Schmitt explains how he thinks Hume confronts and defeats the various sceptical doubts that can be gleaned from these difficult passages. Schmitt starts with an examination of Hume's "Of scepticism with regard to reason" before turning to the Conclusion of Book I to show how these doubts do not defeat the justification produced by causal inferences.

The strengths of this book are numerous. Its structure is extremely helpful, with the previews and summaries enhancing the reader's understanding of Schmitt's multitudinous in-depth arguments. Even within the chapters, Schmitt helpfully relates his varied discussions to other pertinent arguments throughout the book. His combination of historical scholarship, familiarity with contemporary issues and attention to textual detail seem to me ideal for his particular project. His arguments are usually well-calibrated, with the conclusions appropriately qualified. One example: while he spends a good deal of time discussing Locke and his relationship to Hume, because this is a book about Hume and not Locke he does not spend much time defending his reading of Locke. But he rightly points out that "It will not strictly matter whether I interpret Locke correctly, as long as the interpretation I give is one that Hume might very well have adopted himself" (42). Interestingly, Schmitt's overall goal seems surprisingly modest when he explicitly articulates it:

My ambition in this book is . . . limited to compiling enough support for the veritistic interpretation to make it a contender among candidates for the correct interpretation of Hume's epistemology in the Treatise, without attempting a systematic comparison with competing interpretations. (1; cf. 398-399).

This assessment, while admirably humble, raises my first major point of concern.

Quite simply, I worry that Schmitt has set his interpretive bar too low. For it seems that this interpretation was already a contender.3 Schmitt correctly notes that while Francis Dauer4 was one of the first to delineate a reliabilist interpretation of Hume almost 35 years ago, others have followed suit (23, note 39). Indeed, some commentators have already specifically argued against interpreting Hume as reliabilist. Such a debate strongly suggests that this interpretation is already considered by many to be a contender. So does Schmitt's book make the reliabilist interpretation more of a contender than it was previously? To be sure, Schmitt's book is, to the best of my knowledge, the most comprehensive reliabilist interpretation ever produced and provides some very plausible readings of some very difficult texts. Ironically, though, in the end some of the major qualifications made in the course of this meticulous argument have also made the view less plausible.

One major qualification that worries me lies at the heart of the reliabilist account of justified belief that Schmitt attributes to Hume. He summarizes this account as follows:

A belief is defeasibly justified just in case it results from a reliable belief-forming operation.

A belief is overall justified just in case it is defeasibly justified, and this defeasible justification is not defeated by any undefeated countervailing doubts available to the subject with regard to the belief. (32)

I agree whole-heartedly that including some kind of notion of defeat is essential for any interpretation of Humean justification. Surprisingly, though, Schmitt does not maintain that the no-defeater clause he attributes to Hume is derived from "a deeper reliability account of justified belief" or "a condition instrumental to veritistic value" (32). Nor does he maintain that this condition "is imposed because the pragmatics of epistemic evaluation require it" (33). More importantly, he claims that he can find "no evidence for attributing" such derivations to Hume (33). Consequently, Schmitt concedes that this book does not attribute a "pure reliability or pure veritistic account" to Hume (33).

Schmitt's candor is commendable. But I am puzzled that he does not find this admission more problematic than he does. After all, part of the point of offering a reliabilist reading of Humean justified belief is to provide a view that at least "overlaps with a naturalism about justified belief" (396). But because this no-defeater requirement "is not clearly a natural property" (166), the epistemology that Schmitt attributes to Hume is not clearly a naturalistic one as far as I can tell. At least it is not clearly a purely naturalistic account that eliminates or accounts for (by way of, say, reduction or supervenience) its non-natural elements. Unfortunately, an account that is not purely a veritistic account is difficult to distinguish from its competitors. For many of them would embrace the notion that justification is related to truth to some degree, presumably making their views impurely veritistic as well. Granted, on the contemporary scene epistemologists sometimes talk of reliability as another "component" of knowledge distinct from justified true belief. So these are extremely complicated issues. Nevertheless, it seems that finding textual support for a more purely veritistic or naturalistic account or derivation of Humean defeat should be high on the list of future projects for reliabilist interpretations of Hume. Otherwise, I do not see such a reliabilist interpretation as ultimately becoming a serious contender for the correct interpretation of Hume.

Let me expand on this last point. At the end of the book, Schmitt produces a long list of further topics one who wishes to interpret Hume as a reliabilist should explore: memory, testimony, general rules, scientific methodology, and so on (398). Even if Schmitt or some other interpreter is successful in providing reliabilist readings of Hume's thoughts on such topics, these projects seem subject to the principle of diminishing returns. For if we never have any evidence that Hume could provide a veritistic or naturalistic account of defeat, then these further semi-reliabilist interpretations are not going to show that the reliabilist interpretation is more likely than alternative readings. Such investigations would seem to be merely puzzle-solving, to use a Kuhnian phrase. To make this view more of a serious contender, it seems that we must either try to "purify" its notion of Humean defeat or systematically show how it is superior to its competitors.

Perhaps we could argue that this impure veritistic view significantly advances Humean interpretation because it provides another panoptic vision of how Hume can avoid the scepticism so many have attributed to him. To Schmitt's credit, he argues that we should not take sceptical readings too lightly. That is to say, in the first chapter, one of the constraints that Schmitt places on any adequate theory of knowledge is that "we may reasonably fear" that beliefs based on causal inferences may lack justification (19-20). On this front, I simply disagree with how he reads many passages related to scepticism. Allow me to conclude with a discussion of one such sceptical issue.

As is well known, many have taken Hume's discussion of inductive/causal reasoning to imply that the products of such reasoning are not epistemically justified. Schmitt disagrees. In key parts of the argument (e.g., Treatise 1.3.6 and the Abstract), he interprets Hume as attacking Lockean reasoning, not causal reasoning itself (167-170). Although Schmitt gives an in-depth argument for this reading, I do not find it plausible. To elaborate on this point, consider how Schmitt handles a key passage from that "vertiginous" Conclusion of Book I, in which Hume writes:

by what criterion shall I distinguish her [truth], even if fortune shou'd at last guide me on her foot-steps? After the most accurate [and exact] of my reasonings, I can give no reason why I shou'd assent to it; and feel nothing but a strong propensity to consider objects strongly in that view, under which they appear to me. ( T265)5

Schmitt objects that Hume cannot literally mean that we have no epistemic reason to trust our reasonings in matters of truth because he believes that Hume has already provided such a reason elsewhere. So Schmitt claims that: "It is best to interpret him. . . as merely reciting the conclusion of the pivotal argument of (T86-90): that he lacks a Lockean reason to assent to the conclusion of any causal inference" (344). This interpretation may be the best if one is antecedently convinced that the reliabilist reading of Hume is correct. But Hume provides no hint whatsoever that he is thinking of the section Schmitt mentions. Moreover, the text itself becomes quite puzzling if Hume is only worried about Lockean reasoning in the pursuit of the truth. If Hume had at one point written something along the following lines: "By 'reason' I sometimes mean 'Lockean reason'", then this reading would be more convincing. As it stands, though, every time Schmitt employs this strategy, it becomes increasingly implausible.

I hope the worries that I have expressed prod those who read Hume as a reliabilist to search for more purity in their interpretations and provoke them to look again at some of Hume's sceptical comments. These worries notwithstanding, I highly recommend this book. As I have stated, in many ways it is a model for how one can integrate historical scholarship and contemporary concerns. Debates will continue and disagreements may persist, but the outstanding quality of Schmitt's careful work will stand the test of time.

1 More specifically, Schmitt compares Hume's epistemology to the reliabilism that Alvin Goldman delineates in his Epistemology and Cognition (Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1986).

2 David Owen, Hume's Reason (New York: Oxford University Press, 1999)

3 Here and henceforth, when I simply write "contender", I mean "contender for a correct interpretation of Hume's epistemology in the Treatise".

4 Francis W. Dauer, "Hume's Skeptical Solution and the Causal Theory of Knowledge", The Philosophical Review 89, 3 (1980): 357-378. Interestingly, Dauer also compares Hume's epistemology to Goldman's, although Dauer relies on Goldman's earlier causal theory of knowing.

5 This is Schmitt's quotation of Hume from page 344. I have added the "and exact" because presumably Schmitt neglected to include this part of Hume's text by accident.