Hume's Social Philosophy: Human Nature and Commercial Sociability in A Treatise of Human Nature

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Christopher J. Finlay, Hume's Social Philosophy: Human Nature and Commercial Sociability in A Treatise of Human Nature, Continuum, 2007, 202pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826491626.

Reviewed by Lorraine Besser-Jones, University of Waterloo


Hume's Treatise is littered with notes and commentary on the social context in which Hume observed human nature. While commentators have noted the important role the social context plays in particular aspects of Hume's theory, such as in his discussion of the origin of justice, Christopher J. Finlay's Hume's Social Philosophy argues that Hume's understanding of the social context of human nature underlies all aspects of the Treatise, and, in fact, serves as its unifying core. The claim is a bold one, and Finlay's defense of it is impressive.

Finlay sets out for himself two aims. The first is to offer an interpretation of the Treatise that shows how its three books "cohere" in ways which others haven't sufficiently appreciated; the second is to settle some live debates about Hume's understanding of the relationship between human nature and its historical contexts. Let me now turn to a consideration of his success in each aim.

As previously noted, Finlay's main argument is that the three books of the Treatise are unified by their social context; that is, by "the fact that the Treatise as a whole, and the philosophy it articulated, were built around social concerns, concepts, categories, and experiences" (8). I think Finlay succeeds in showing that these social dimensions aid us in understanding each book of the Treatise. Most notable here is Finlay's illustration of how the social context informs Hume's Book I discussion of reason -- an area that is frequently explored in isolation from the remaining books of the Treatise. Here Finlay argues that reason's role is simply to help us navigate our experience. Its "chief purpose is commonly to figure out how best to act in relation to the contexts in which individuals find themselves, intervening amongst objects, pursuing interests and exercising powers amongst other persons who are doing the same" (77).

It is because of this aim that Hume's discussion of causality occupies such a prominent position in Book I. Reason, Finlay argues, "is concerned with the causality of passions both because these prompt it to act in the first place and because its attempts to understand experience in terms of causal connections comprehends the causal efficacy of passion as well as other types of event" (70). Given this account of reason as something that is inseparable from our experiences, Finlay argues that Book I must be seen as "belonging to a motivational context that awaits its full exposition in Book II" (70).

Finlay's discussion of how reason is connected to the social context in which human nature operates is both convincing and informative; however, here, as in many other areas, I was left wondering whether or not this contextualized approach towards understanding the central issues of Hume's philosophy provided an interpretation that departed from the standard, largely non-contextualized, interpretations. In other words, it wasn't clear to me that understanding the social context of Hume's discussions made an essential contribution to how we interpret those discussions. Finlay seems content to show that there is a social dimension underlying and unifying the three books of the Treatise; some readers, myself included, may be less so content. I would have liked to have seen how the social context changes the way we should think about the issues. For example, Finlay claims that "the theory of causal reasoning should be seen as designed, at least in part, to explain the forms of action and interaction (i.e. desiring, thinking and acting) seen in the common life of society" (77). He has convinced me that we should see the theory of causal reasoning as so designed. But what follows from this? What impact does this change have on how we understand the theory of causal reasoning itself? Successful demonstration of this aspect -- were it to hold -- would have required Finlay to engage significantly more in the secondary literature than he currently does.

One area where Finlay does try to show the implications of his contextualized approach is in his discussion of Hume's politics. He argues that those views that fail to appreciate the social dimension mistakenly characterize Hume's political theory as exhibiting a commitment to "possessive individualism", whereby the role of government is to provide a framework whereby self-interested individuals can interact (125). Finlay argues, however, that understanding the conceptual and normative priority of society to politics requires that we interpret Hume as a "republican consequentialist" (150).

According to Finlay, Hume's political theory is republican, in that it holds liberty to be a value we aspire to, yet consequentialist, in that particular schemes advancing liberty are restrained by their ability to maintain the "peace and order" requisite to preservation of the social life already in place (150). This interpretation of Hume follows along an intriguing discussion of Hume's ongoing challenge to square the selfish tendencies of human nature with its propensity towards sociability. As Finlay correctly notes, the normative priority of Hume's "commitment to the social" requires that a particular form of government preserve the social first and foremost, yet Hume's recognition of the selfish, avidity-driven tendencies of human nature requires also that people enjoy as much liberty as is compatible with the commitment to the social, where liberty is concerned primarily with "those [liberties] enjoyed in the ownership and disposal of property and other goods and in the exercise of personal powers (such as wealth) in society" (147; original emphasis).

Finlay's treatment of this tension between the social and asocial aspects of human nature makes a significant contribution to the surprisingly small body of literature on this issue. Of particular note are his comparisons between Hobbes' and Hume's accounts of pride: Hobbes, of course, sees pride as contributing towards people's antisocial tendencies, whereas Hume sees pride as a social mechanism, bringing people together. The contrast between these two views is dramatic and certainly worthy of further exploration. My one concern with Finlay's discussion of this contrast between Hume and Hobbes and of the more general tension of sociality and asociality within Hume's own view is that it proceeds in a piecemeal fashion: Finlay lays out seeds of his view throughout the book, but leaves it largely up to the reader to piece them together, and, in effect, shortchanges the strength of his argument. Here, again, Finlay would have benefited from a focused and detailed discussion of this tension -- both of how it is currently treated in the secondary literature, and of how his contextualized approach helps to shed new light on how we ought to understand Hume's theory.

Finley's second aim is to settle some debates about the "historicity of human nature" in Hume. The central question of this debate is whether or not Hume's account of human nature allows for historical variation. Answers to this question are complicated by Hume's repeated claims that the basic principles and structure of human nature are constant and invariable, yet simultaneous reliance on examples specific to the social environment in which Hume observed human nature. This tension leads Alasdair Macintyre, for example, to argue that while Hume sought to give a universal account of human nature, he ultimately fails to do so because his understanding of human nature is so embedded in his own social environment. Finlay, however, suggests what he takes to be a "more charitable" resolution to the tension (7). According to Finlay, Hume relies on the social context because he recognizes that "human nature was most fully instantiated in the eighteenth-century contexts of polite British and French society" (7, my emphasis).

On this interpretation, Hume succeeds in giving an account of human nature as constant and invariable, while drawing heavily on the social context to support his account, because the particular social context that he draws on is one that allows human nature to thrive: it is one that allows for human nature to be fully instantiated. Finlay's strongest example of this draws heavily on the consumerism rampant in eighteenth-century Britain, which created a situation in which social status became tied to the possession of goods. This particular social dynamic provides the perfect setting for Hume to observe people's passions for pride. That Hume uses the social dynamic as a setting, however, does not mean that his account of pride as a facet of human nature is limited only to this context. Rather, Finlay suggests that Hume's understanding of pride is best understood as "appealing to invariant propensities in human nature" that are "nonetheless subject to minute variations initiated by artifice and prompting corresponding innovation and variety in the range of things that can cause pride" (95).

Finlay's analysis and exposition of Hume's theory of pride is one of the clearest and most insightful around, although I worry that his focus on the social context of consumerism leads him to overlook the significance of other, feasibly more important, causes of pride, such as virtue. Nonetheless, I'm not sure that Finlay has, in his discussion of pride, offered a defense of his interpretation of the historicity of human nature in Hume, as much as he has offered an illustration. As I'm inclined to agree with Finlay's interpretation, I'm not too bothered by this. Others might be.

In the end, I think Finlay's book is insightful and worthwhile. Finlay succeeds in illustrating how it is that the social context underlies all three books of the Treatise, and offers a prima facie convincing interpretation of how we ought to situate Hume's project. My criticisms have been concerned largely with the relative modesty of his aims and his lack of sustained engagement with secondary literature; these concerns aside, this book will be of interest to anyone interested in the social dimensions of Hume's thought, as well as to anyone looking for a clear exposition of the central themes of the Treatise.