Hume's Theory of Causation: A Quasi-Realist Interpretation

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Angela Coventry, Hume's Theory of Causation: A Quasi-Realist Interpretation, Continuum, 2006, 166pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 0826486355.

Reviewed by John Biro, The University of Florida



The thesis of this book is that Hume holds a quasi-realist theory of causation.  He is neither the realist about causation some interpreters (Strawson, Wright) see him as, nor the anti-realist others (Basson, Stroud) take him to be.  If we read him as a quasi-realist, we can reconcile the seemingly contradictory passages on which these opposing interpretations are based and do not have to choose between them.  In addition, we will see that Hume has a "ready response to what is commonly thought to be an utterly devastating problem for [his] theory of causation," its alleged inability to distinguish between accidental and law-like regularities.

Of the one hundred and fifty pages of the book, the first seventy-five are taken up by a gallop through various forms of realism  (causal, moral, scientific) and anti-realism (reductionism, constructivism, instrumentalism) in an attempt to develop a general -- "topic-neutral" -- characterization of these rival positions.  Quasi-realism is then described as an "intermediate alternative" between realism and anti-realism. It consists in the endorsement of one of the theses traditionally associated with realism and the rejection of another.  The first thesis is that, at least with respect to some domains of discourse, statements concerning the domain have truth-values and that some of them are, in fact, true.  The second is that these true statements are true in virtue of some objective properties of the entities in the domain.  Anti-realists deny both theses.  A quasi-realist affirms the first, but not the second.

The second half of the book is devoted to showing that Hume's "theory of causation" is a version of quasi-realism.  We are told that Hume "recognizes causal judgments as genuine propositions, susceptible to truth and falsehood" and that he thinks that causal judgments made by the "delicate causalist" are true.  What this means is that in "an ideal causal network" (that is, the careful and experienced causal reasoner's "general view about how the features of the world are causally related to each other"), the "connections … are an accurate representation of the causal connections … in the world."  The possession of such an ideal causal network comes about through practice, in particular, through developing the habit of adhering to general rules.


1)             It is not altogether clear just what it is Hume is supposed to be a quasi-realist about.  There is talk of Hume's theory of causation, of course, and also much of his analysis of causation.  Neither of these labels suggest anything very Humean.  The central questions in his "new science of man" have to do with how the mind acquires its contents and what it does with those contents.   Hume's analysis of our idea of causation is that it has three components, the ideas of contiguity, temporal priority and necessary connection.  Searching for the source of these component ideas in experience, he finds the third elusive.  He then offers an account of causal inference as a "species of sensation," rather than as a product of reason.  (Rather confusingly, he also uses 'causal reasoning' as a label for this kind of non-rational inference.) Part of the account is the suggestion that the origin of the idea of necessary connection lies in us, rather than in the objects we think are necessarily connected: it is an internal impression, rather than one of sensation.  One can call this account a theory, and a projectivist one, at that, but it is not a theory of causation. Nor is it an analysis of anything, though it presupposes a certain analysis of the idea of causation.

2)            One may think that the brief characterization of quasi-realism given above is all that is needed to enable one to raise the question, is Hume a quasi-realist in that sense?  It is not clear what is added by a lengthy, and, it must be said, rather superficial, review the author gives us of every imaginable version of realism and anti-realism with respect to a variety of domains. (The twenty-five-page chapter in which this is done consists of brief quotations accompanied by no less than a hundred-and-five footnotes.)

3)            The author's characterization of quasi-realism as an intermediate position between realism and anti-realism is a bit odd, given that the leading exponent of quasi-realism (and the author's professed inspiration), Simon Blackburn, cautions that "quasi-realism is not really another 'ism' in the sense of a position or an ideology in the same space as realism or anti-realism."  Blackburn sees it, rather, as aiming to change the dialectic of the debate by questioning whether the categories and oppositions in terms of which it is usually conducted are fruitful or illuminating.  Puzzlingly, the author herself notes this and yet insists, virtually in the same breath, that "quasi-realism must be defined by what it opposes."

4)            Quasi-realism, as characterized by the author, is no realism about the property in question, namely, the property we attribute to objects or events of being necessarily connected with others.  So, if we attribute the property to objects or events, we are mistaken. Thus this interpretation attributes to Hume what is, after all, a kind of error theory. If the truth-makers of our beliefs are different from what we think they are (facts about our mind, rather than about the objects of our thought), we are in error. 

5)            But then, as I noted above, comes a twist. While what gives me the idea that there is a necessary connection between A and B is the internal impression of expectation I have as a result of my experience of a constant conjunction between them (better, instances of them), that is not, as one might have expected, what makes my judgment that A causes B true.  That judgment is true, according to Coventry, in virtue of the fact that "the causal network in the imagination of the practiced causalist 'matches up' to the system of causes in the world." More, "… the ideal causal network reveals the causal structure of the world." (145) How is this different from the second thesis of realism quasi-realists reject?

6)            As noted in 1) above, Hume is interested in giving an account not of causation but of causal reasoning and, in particular, of the origin of our idea of necessary connection.  So, to speak of his theory of causation is, to say the least, misleading.  Once we remind ourselves of this, the whole realist/irrealist debate may come to seem irrelevant. Perhaps Hume is a quasi-realist in Blackburn's sense, after all!

7)            Sad to say, the book is very poorly written. Virtually no paragraph is without an infelicity, if not a downright grammatical error. Some of this is just carelessness and does no real harm.  (Hume's "rules by which to judge causes and effects" becomes, throughout, "rules to judge causes and effects.") However, sometimes the carelessness leads to sloppy philosophy. (An example is the first problem noted above.) And even when it does not ("things depend on we beings who," "a theory that explains the origin behind these remarks," "'To break' as in to break one's arm or leg, is to have something cause one's arm or leg bone to be broken," and so on, and on …), it makes the book a painful read.