Humean Nature: How Desire Explains Action, Thought, and Feeling

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Neil Sinhababu, Humean Nature: How Desire Explains Action, Thought, and Feeling, Oxford University Press, 2017, 214pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198783893.

Reviewed by Nomy Arpaly, Brown University


Sometimes you still hear someone refer to the belief-desire view of human motivation and of acting for reasons as "The Standard Theory". The days in which the theory was "standard" are long gone, and over the years it has been repeatedly maligned to the point that it is possible to defend it in such a contrarian tone as Neil Sinhababu's. His book defends the aforementioned view and more generally the view that reason is but the slave of the passions. It is not a work in the history of philosophy and so it would probably make sense to refer to it as defending a neo-Humean position, though Sinhababu calls it simply "Humean", which admittedly makes for better word play on "Human". The book is worth reading for anyone who cares about the relevant debate, either as a neo-Humean or as a supporter of a more Reason-oriented view of people.

Though the book is not particularly thick -- no footnotes or endnotes! -- and written fairly pithily as well, it is packed with diverse arguments and hard to summarize. Sinhababu begins by outlining the issue and making sure we know that his endorsement of the Humean or neo-Humean view of motivation and of acting for reasons is unadorned and unqualified. He holds that intrinsic desires never change through reasoning. In this respect, he tolerates no "treachery", of which he accuses Michael Smith, referring to Smith's claiming to accommodate the Humean view of motivation (though not of rationality) and yet holding the view that intrinsic desires can change as a result of deliberation. Sinhababu also holds that belief/desire motivation is the only sort that exists. He is in this way more extreme than many philosophers, myself included, who qualify as neo-Humean due to their rejection of what Kantians call "non-empirical motives" but allow that in addition to desires, motivation can come through blind habit or "a-rational" emotional responses or intentions that are not, at heart, desires.

In Chapter 2 he discusses the properties of desire. In his view of the nature of desire Sinhababu draws heavily on the work of Timothy Schroeder, author of The Three Faces of Desire. While he does not fully accept Schroeder's detailed view, he does borrow a key insight from him: that desire is most distinguished by its systematic effects on three things, namely motivation (though that need not "kick in" when you desire, say, that the square root of 2 be rational), the phenomena of pleasure and displeasure (pleasure involves things going the way we want them to, displeasure involves the reverse -- though it gets more complicated), and patterns of attention (if you have a certain desire, you'll tend to notice, disproportionally, things that are relevant to your desire). Sinhababu also points out that these effects can be amplified by vivid representation of a desire's object and, of course, defends the view that intrinsic desires cannot be changed by believing or reasoning alone (and often cannot be changed by more laborious means either, as is the case with sexual orientation). I think Sinhababu would have benefitted from Schroeder's more careful treatment of the all-things-being-equal-which-they-rarely-are character of the three effects of desire, despite the understandable need not to make the chapter too long. For one minor example, Sinhababu later writes that how much we enjoy daydreaming about something simply correlates with how much we are motivated to bring it about, which strikes me as too quick. Some people greatly enjoy daydreaming about things that they would never bring about, even for a good bribe and with Gyges's ring.

The rest of the book -- that is, about three quarters of it -- involves attempts to refute various claims, made by various philosophers, of the form "desire-based theory can't possibly explain why P" and critiques of specific arguments made to support these claims. The earlier chapters are ordered according to the specific features of desire that come into use in them -- motivational aspect, hedonic aspect, attentional aspect, susceptibility to amplification by vivid representations, imperviousness to reasoning -- and later discussions are unified by the overarching theme of showing what desire can do. After Chapter 2 is where the action is -- and hence the difficulty in summarizing the book. In the opinion of this fellow neo-Humean, Sinhababu is successful in some of his attempts and fails in others; his take on human and Humean nature nuanced at times and a touch too simple at other times. Much to his credit, all of his discussions are engaging, and he writes clearly, without, for example, confusing innocent readers by introducing novel versions of the labels "internalism" and "externalism".

Let me present a few samples. Sinhababu responds to a well-known case presented by Stephen Darwall -- the case of Roberta, who grew up comfortably in a small community with little awareness of the extent of human suffering that exists elsewhere (52). At university, she sees a film about the plight of poor people exploited brutally by the companies they work for. Roberta is shocked and dismayed by the suffering of the workers and as a result becomes involved in organizing a boycott against the offending corporations -- not the sort of action that one would have expected of her before she had seen the movie. Darwall holds that a desire-based theory of human motivation cannot account for conversions such as Roberta's. Surely one cannot say that before seeing the film Roberta already had a desire to alleviate human suffering and that the film only showed her a way of doing so.

Sinhababu points out that the Humean thing to stipulate is not a desire to alleviate human suffering but rather a desire that people not suffer -- presumably Roberta would be happy rather than upset if someone else stepped in and alleviated the suffering of the workers, thus robbing her of an opportunity to alleviate suffering. Could Roberta have had a desire that people not suffer (also known as an aversion to human suffering) before she saw the film? Certainly, says Sinhababu, and such a desire can explain the very unpleasant emotions she feels when she sees the film. Recall we typically experience displeasure when we realize something is the case which we desire not to be the case, and pleasure when things align with what we want. A sadistic counterpart of Roberta, with a desire that people suffer, would have enjoyed the film and reacted by excitedly exploring his chances of owning a sweat shop or becoming an anti-union goon. Roberta before the film is not motivated to act politically because she is ignorant of the extent of suffering in the world, and such knowledge of it as she does have is not in the forefront of her mind and is not accompanied by vivid representations of the sort that a good movie can provide. I find Sinhababu's response to Darwall's challenge convincing. Imagine a morally neutral case: a carefree person, Carrie, reads a powerful account of the dangers of failing to save for retirement, complete with vivid illustrations of the power of compound interest. Suddenly she is filled with anxiety and motivated to save money and invest it, to the surprise of her friends. It is quite unlikely that before receiving the relevant explanations, Carrie did not have a desire to do well financially in the future. Had she no desire for financial wellbeing she would not have felt such anxiety when made aware of the relevant economic facts, and so it is not altogether strange to hold that the same desire motivates her to start saving.

In Chapter 4, Sinhababu tackles the apparent motivational force that moral judgments seem to have -- at least some of the time. Sinhababu holds that moral judgments and moral motivation are both ordinarily caused by what he calls "moral emotions", and thus they ordinarily occur together. The view is complex, but the main gist appears to be this: moral emotions normally cause moral beliefs in a way that is analogous to the way color perceptions normally cause color beliefs. These are emotions like anger, guilt, pride, admiration, shame, contempt, and so on. If we admire a person's character, for example, we normally believe she is admirable as a result (though our robust tendency to assume the world matches our emotions is defeasible, like our tendency to trust our color vision). This is how we come to take a person to be virtuous. The thought of stealing, for example, produces outrage, and so we regard stealing as outrageous, and therefore bad. Emotions are similar to color perceptions but are different from them in that every emotion has a desire component. The hedonic tone of morally relevant emotions -- the "positive" nature of admiration and the "negative" nature of contempt -- is dictated by desire. This, according to Sinhababu, explains why moral beliefs often come with moral motivation. The same desires that cause the thought of stealing to be unpleasant also motivate one to avoid it.

Sinhababu holds his view to be compatible with a wide variety of metaethical positions, including the view that properties like goodness and badness (or being admirable, being despicable, etc.) exist the way moral realists think they do and emotions are perceptions or direct experiences of these evaluative properties, a view represented by Christine Tappolet. However, recall that he takes the hedonic tone of morally relevant emotions to be set by the desires they contain, and desires, to a good neo-Humean, are not perceptions. They do not represent anything. We attribute goodness to actions when we feel pleasant emotions towards them and the pleasure inherent to these emotions occurs because of our intrinsic desires towards the actions (or their motives, outcomes, etc) -- not because it reflects an evaluative property of the actions, such as goodness. If Alonso despises Teresa for the same character traits for which Spencer admires her, and the sole difference between them is that Spencer wants there to be people with Teresa's character traits while Alonso wants no one to have these traits, how is one of them misperceiving her character? Perhaps Sinhababu's view is not as ecumenical as he wants it to be.

In Chapter 6 Sinhababu responds to Michael Bratman's views on intention, beginning with his negative view to the effect that intention cannot be explained in terms of beliefs and desires. On Sinhababu's view, you intend that something occur if: you desire that it occur, your desire is combined with a belief that a situation will materialize in which you can make it more likely by performing a certain action, and, furthermore, it is true that if your desire combined with a belief that the situation in question is (already) the case, you would immediately perform the action (that is, be sufficiently motivated by the desire and belief combination to actually perform the action).

Imagine that Claudine has a desire for sex with her former partner, Gunnar. Her desire is combined with the belief that Gunnar will come to Paris on business sometime in the future, and that as soon as he is in Paris, asking him out would make such sex a lot more likely. Claudine thus has an instrumental desire to ask Gunnar out when he arrives. Suppose further that if Claudine were to believe that Gunnar is in Paris right now she would have asked him out immediately. Does all this imply that she intends to have sex with Gunnar? I suspect not. Suppose Claudine has a competing desire -- a desire to avoid emotional entanglements with her notorious ex, which sleeping with him would likely bring about. While Claudine knows that if Gunnar were to show up in Paris today she would be unable to resist asking him out, she harbors some hope that in the future he might be at least somewhat resistible to her, and so she makes no plans at all regarding his expected trip, torn by her conflicting desires and unable to decide now whether she will ask him out then. Perhaps she even considers a plan to "tie herself to the mast" by traveling to Australia and staying there until Gunnar's visit had come and gone. In such scenarios it would be very strange to say that Claudine intends to have sex with Gunnar, and it would be strange for reasons that align well with Bratman's view.

The above discussions are, as I have said, only a sample of this "action packed" book. In addition to motivation, moral judgment and intention, Sinhababu discusses reasons and rationality, will-power, the sense of obligation, agency, transparency in deliberation, daydreaming and more. He engages with a wide variety of "anti-Humean" philosophers along the way but manages not to drown in a sea of literature.

About that contrarian tone: Sinhababu's sense of humor can be refreshing, but occasionally turns juvenile. For example, consider his "translation" of William of Occam as saying "if you invoke unnecessary entities, I'll cut you with my razor" (117). The examples involving sexual desire add up to a disproportional number and together have an unintentional "one-track mind" effect. Along with the frequent mentions of hunger and thirst, they do a disservice to the goal of showing that desires dominate the whole wide variety of human behavior and not only their traditional domain of the "beastly". I appreciate the author's heartfelt sneering at the idea that there is something immoral about promiscuous women but it gets awkward, to say the least, when he writes -- in jest? -- that he admires promiscuous women and approves of their deeds because they increase overall pleasure in the world (81). There are some statements in the book that belong in a blog post or a friendly Q&A session, as when he tells us: "Sometimes I am frustrated with my opponents, who I'm sure have been hungry and thirsty and fallen in love too, but who seem to have forgotten what all that was like when objecting to the Humean theory" (199).

The book ends with an entirely unnecessary jab at those of us who do not agree with Sinhababu's view. Paraphrasing Hume, he writes: "If we take into our hand any volume of neo-Kantian or neo-Aristotelian moral psychology, for instance, let us ask: does desire leave us with any need for the additional psychological properties it invokes to explain how humans think, feel and act?" Sinhababu tells us that for any such book, the answer is "no" and that therefore we must -- what else? -- "commit it then to the flames for it can contain nothing but sophistry and illusion". This is contrarianism for its own sake, and, at the risk of being pedantic, I will also note that Sinhababu's neo-Humeanism does not imply that desire by itself explains how humans think, and strictly speaking it does not even imply that desire, without any other psychological "properties", explains how we feel and act.

Such tomfoolery notwithstanding, this book is a valuable contribution to the ongoing philosophical discussion of moral motivation, human motivation in general, and the vagaries of the human heart.