Hume's Moral Philosophy and Contemporary Psychology

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Philip A. Reed and Rico Vitz (eds.), Hume's Moral Philosophy and Contemporary Psychology, Routledge, 2018, 386pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138744752.

Reviewed by Angela M. Coventry, Portland State University


David Hume's eighteenth-century vision of a science of the mind resonates in a variety of contemporary sciences. For instance, Jerry Fodor views Hume's first work, A Treatise of Human Nature (1739-40), as the "foundational" text in cognitive science,[1] and in neuroscience, Patricia Churchland links the human biological capacity for caring to Hume's moral sentiment.[2] The aim of the present collection is to make connections between Hume's moral philosophy and contemporary work in psychology, and the empirical sciences more generally. A lot of work has been done already on this with Aristotelian virtue ethics, but the relevance of Hume's moral theory has been neglected. This volume thus "fills a gap" in the secondary literature (2). There are fourteen chapters by leading scholars plus the editors provide an introduction that gives context for the essays and a concluding chapter that provides suggestions for future research directions. This review provides a brief synopsis of each paper and an evaluation of the volume as a whole.

The first essay, by Margaret Watkins, "Beyond the 'Disease of the Learned': Hume on Passional Disorders," explores Hume's own personal bout with the 'disease of the learned' in his early life while composing the Treatise of Human Nature, and its relation to recent psychological categories from the Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders (DSM). Watkins considers the relation of mental illness and vice as a continuum in Hume's philosophy and develops a therapeutic approach to treating mental illness based on his theory of how to cultivate aesthetic judgment.

The next three essays defend Hume's ethics against various 'situationist' challenges according to which his virtue ethics lacks empirical support. For example, virtue ethics is committed to the thesis that virtues are common or widespread yet research in social psychology suggests otherwise and holds instead that our moral agency is very much influenced by various factors of the situations we find ourselves in. Philip A. Reed, in "Hume on the Rarity of Virtue," shows that Hume does not claim that virtues are common or widespread. The next essay, "Spontaneity, Intuition, and Humean Virtue," by Erin Frykholm, takes on the situationist challenge that empirical data show that people are not reliable when it comes to virtuous behavior, and the importance of affect and non-conscious factors in how we interpret and act in our own situations. Frykholm shows that Hume's ethics can in fact account for the role of affect and non-conscious factors that impact human behavior, and the ways in which our behavior in particular situations might not always reflect our considered values. Rico Vitz in, "Character, Culture, and Humean Virtue Ethics: Insights from Situationism and Confucianism" takes on situationist criticisms of virtues ethics' commitment to globalism: (i) that virtue must be manifested consistently across diverse conditions, (ii) that virtue must be manifested regularly under similar conditions, and (iii) that the occurrence of a single character trait is related to the occurrence of other similar traits (91). Critics of virtue ethics such as John Doris show that recent empirical research in social psychology does not support globalism. Vitz argues that Hume is not in fact committed to globalism and that Humean virtue ethics (especially when linked to some aspects of Confucian ethics) is better positioned to answer such situationist critiques than Aristotelian ethics.

Hume on sympathy is the focus of the next six chapters. "Empathy, Autism, and Hume" by Katharina Paxman shows how Hume's sympathy-based ethics can "accommodate" the contemporary empirical evidence that supports the existence of individuals who lack empathy but yet have the capacity for moral judgements (117). Annette Pierdziwol in "Cultivating Empathic Concern and Altruistic Motivation: Insights from Hume and Batson" considers the relation between sympathy and altruism in Hume's moral theory, and draws comparisons with recent work by the social psychologist C. Daniel Batson on the empathy-altruism hypothesis. In the seventh chapter, "Preserving Practicality: In Defense of Hume's Sympathy-Based Ethics," Lorenzo Greco defends the role of sympathy in Hume's morals against some objections made by contemporary Humean Jesse Prinz that dispute the relation between sympathy and morality. Greco further illustrates how sympathy forms an objective basis for moral judgment and allows for the practicalities as well as complexities of human agency.

"Hume, Bloom, and Moral Inclusion" by Anne Jaap Jacobson compares Hume on sympathy (and empathy) with the work of contemporary psychologist Paul Bloom. According to Jacobson, both views expand positively the notion of our moral community but both fail to provide adequate grounding for moral inclusion. Lorraine L. Besser's "Empathy, Interdependency, and Morality: Building from Hume's Account" defends the role of sympathy in Hume's ethics against criticisms made by Prinz and Bloom. Besser shows how empathy "creates an intersubjective base that informs moral agency and shapes moral interests" and that this fundamental role that empathy plays in morality goes "unchallenged" by such recent criticisms (222). "The Philosophical Power of Hume's Notion of Love" by Christine Swanton addresses the interrelation of Hume on sympathy, morality and the passion of love. In particular, Swanton develops Hume's notion of virtuous love, argues that his take on love resolves a long-standing paradox about love and further shows that sympathy when combined with various kinds of virtuous love can work to avoid "distortions" in ethical judgement (227).

The final four essays take up Hume's moral psychology and its implications for a contemporary science of the mind, theory of action and moral and political philosophy. In "Hume on the Methods and Limits of the Science of Human Nature," Saul Traiger examines key elements in Hume's science of the mind and illuminates how contemporary cognitive and brain sciences carry on in a Humean spirit. Michael B. Gill's "Hume on Moral Motivation" considers three types of moral motivation in Hume: (i) virtuous-trait motivation, (ii) approval-of-another motivation, and (iii) approval-of-self motivation, and how they are supported by findings in contemporary psychology of motivation (263). In "Passionate Regulation and the Practicality of Reason," Elizabeth S. Radcliffe finds two things: first that Hume on the self-regulation of the passions is supported by recent psychological studies on emotional regulation, and second that Hume's distinctive kind of reason has a practicality that is often overlooked in recent discussions of practical reason. The final chapter, Eric Schliesser's "Hume on Affective Leadership," connects Hume's account of the passions to his political philosophy. Schliesser explores the notion of "effective affective leadership", that is "the political management of dispositions and emotions" that are favorable to a "minimal" socio-political unity by looking at Hume's take on the rise and fall of the Dutch politician Johan de Witt (324, 311).

The volume's warm and enthusiastic endorsement of recent empirical sciences and its relation to Hume is welcome. As Reed notes in the Introduction, "Hume is necessarily open to what the sciences can teach us about the nature of the mind" (7). The volume shows for sure that while Hume's account of the mind is "made without the tools of modern social science", many of his insights turn out to "survive investigation from work that has been done with those tools" (7). It is great to have in a single volume a variety of illuminating ways in which Hume's morals are relevant to recent empirical work. It would be nice however to have had included some different perspectives on Hume's moral philosophy from other disciplines, for instance, some contributions by psychologists, cognitive scientists or neuroscientists.

There are many experiments via different methods in the recent empirical sciences cited throughout the volume. Yet one central topic that received surprisingly little attention was the actual experimental method used by Hume himself to gain such prescient insights into human nature, and how this method relates to methods in other sciences today. Traiger's fine essay is an exception in this regard and I highly recommend the discussion of Hume on free will in relation to neuroscientist Benjamin Libet's methods and experiments on free will in particular (253ff). But at other times one might wonder whether Hume's experimental method would be consistent with all of the current methods in the sciences mentioned, and so at times some of the positive results of comparing Hume and the empirical sciences runs the risk of seeming a bit trivial or at least incidental.

Hume's experimental science is based on "careful and exact experiments, and the observation of those particular effects, which result from its different circumstances and situations" and from these we glean more general principles of human nature (THN Intro.10).[3] These experiments cannot be made "purposely, with premeditation, and after such a manner as to satisfy itself concerning every particular difficulty which may be" (Ibid.). Premeditated interventions to study human nature by placing humans in controlled circumstances alters the natural course of how the human mind actually operates. As Tamás Demeter has shown, it is not just social experiments that are off limits for the science of the mind but also self-conscious reflection. Introspection cannot serve as the primary experimental basis since reflecting on one's own mental processes distorts them.[4] Given that "reflection and premeditation" may "disturb the operation of my natural principles", this makes it "impossible to form any just conclusion from the phenomenon," and any such findings on this basis are rendered of little use (THN Intro.10).

The relevant experiments are "collected and compared" based on the careful observation of the common events in everyday human life. Human behavior is observed "in company, in affairs, and in their pleasures" (Ibid.). History provides the main experimental basis here since history reveals humans "in all varieties of circumstances and situations," as well as "furnishing us with materials from which we may form our observations and become acquainted with the regular springs of human action and behavior" (EHU 8.1.7). Passions such as "Ambition, avarice, self-love, vanity, friendship, generosity, public spirit" are "mixed in various degrees, and distributed through society, have been, from the beginning of the world, and still are, the source of all the actions and enterprises," observable among human beings (Ibid.). As such things like "records of wars, intrigues, factions, and revolutions, are so many collections of experiments, by which the politician or moral philosopher fixes the principles of his science" (Ibid.).

The sorts of field experiments and trials as described by Batson et al. on empathy,[5] or the studies conducted by Baron and Bronfen on how things like pleasant fragrances can influence our behavior without us noticing,[6] or the hypothesis-testing in Algoe and Haidt on motivation[7] might be of limited use to Hume's own science. At best such experiments might produce results that are incidental to a science that is restricted to experimental findings that do not result from premeditated interventions into human nature. Perhaps today we might judge Hume's method as too restrictive, or perhaps not -- as the volume certainly shows, Hume's method for understanding human nature was a bit of a success and brings about results still relevant in current research -- or we may explore ways in which this method positively or negatively aligns with the various methods adopted in the empirical sciences today. In any case the volume invites further reflections on how these experimental methods in the sciences past and present relate to one another in future discussions of the ongoing relevance of Hume's moral psychology.


Many thanks to Bryan Cwik for comments on an earlier draft.

[1] Jerry Fodor, Hume Variations 2003, New York: Oxford University Press, 134-5.

[2] Patricia Churchland, Braintrust: What Neuroscience Tells Us About Morality, 2011, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 48.

[3] References to Hume's Treatise are to D. F. Norton and M. J. Norton (eds.), A Treatise of Human Nature, 2 vols. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2007, hereafter cited "THN." Citations to the Introduction include paragraph numbers only. References to the Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding are to Tom L. Beauchamp (ed.), An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding: A Critical Edition, Oxford University Press UK, 2000, hereafter cited as "EHU" followed by section, part and paragraph number.

[4] Tamás Demeter (2012) "Hume's Experimental Method," British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 20:3, 577-599, 582.

[5] Batson, C. D., Coke, J. S., Chard, F., Smith, D., & Taliaferro, A. (1979). "Generality of the "Glow of Goodwill": Effects of Mood on Helping and Information Acquisition," Social Psychology Quarterly, 42(2), 176-179. See also Batson, C. Daniel, Polycarpou MP, Harmon-Jones E, Imhoff HJ, Mitchener EC, Bednar LL, Klein TR, Highberger L. (1997) "Empathy and Attitudes: Can Feeling for a Member of a Stigmatized Group Improve Feelings Toward the Group?" Journal of Personality and Social Psychology 72 (1): 105-18.

[6] Baron, Robert & I. Bronfen, Marna. (2006). "A Whiff of Reality: Empirical Evidence Concerning the Effects of Pleasant Fragrances on WorkRelated Behavior," Journal of Applied Social Psychology, 24. 1179-1203. See also Baron, R. A. (1997). "The Sweet Smell of . . . Helping: Effects of Pleasant Ambient Fragrance on Prosocial Behavior in Shopping Malls," Personality and Social Psychology Bulletin, 23(5), 498-503.

[7] Algoe, S. B., & Haidt, J. (2009). "Witnessing Excellence in Action: the "Other-Praising" Emotions of Elevation, Gratitude, and Admiration," The Journal of Positive Psychology, 4(2), 105-127.