Hume's Sceptical Enlightenment

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Ryu Susato, Hume's Sceptical Enlightenment, Edinburgh University Press, 2015, 348pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748699803.

Reviewed by Angela Coventry and Alex Sager, Portland State University


David Hume's social and political philosophy has enjoyed a renaissance in recent years, in part due to the recognition that his approach presents a developed, viable alternative to the dominant Kantian tradition and in part due to increased scholarly engagement with the resources that his History of England offers for his social and political thought. In the last ten years we have had Neil McArthur's David Hume's Political Theory (2007), Russell Hardin's David Hume: Moral and Political Theorist (2007), Andrew Sabl's Hume's Politics: Coordination and Crisis in the "History of England" (2012), and Mark Spencer's David Hume and Eighteenth Century America (2010) -- not to mention Deirdre McCloskey's trilogy The Bourgeois Virtues (2006), Bourgeois Dignity (2011), and Bourgeois Equality (2016) which imbibes the Humean spirit. Despite all of this attention, Hume the social and political philosopher remains enigmatic. Ryu Susato joins the throng of scholars reassessing Hume as a social and political philosopher, in this case through an examination of his status as an Enlightenment figure.

Though Hume was in many respects an advocate of liberty and progress, his criticisms of social contract theory, his basing political legitimacy and authority on convention, and his insistence on subordinating reason to the passions all seem to go against a "contract-based, individualistic and rationalist" understanding of the Enlightenment (conceived as a period of reform, not of conservative adherence to established traditions) (1). Moreover, his apparent support for a national church, his insistence that the immutability of human nature placed limits on utopian schemes, and his pendulum theory of history all lend support to the view that he was a conservative. Susato's book in some respects takes its departure from John Stuart Mill's infamous dismissal of Hume as radical sceptic whose rejection of the possibility of attaining truth made him a Tory. In the 1838 essay, "Bentham," Mill accused Hume of denying reason any power for comparing and evaluating political affairs as better or worse, leading him to prefer the status quo which was compatible with his own "private comforts." Mill's characterization is a caricature of Hume's thought, but he is not alone in believing that Hume's scepticism supports conservatism in his political analysis and attitudes. Susato strives to show that Hume's scepticism does not disqualify him as an Enlightenment figure and indeed is central to a particular approach to the Enlightenment -- a Sceptical Enlightenment (a phrase he borrows from Henry May's The Enlightenment in America [1976].)

To support his account, Susato presents a "historiographical" sense of the Enlightenment to "characterise and locate" the contributions of Hume's social and political philosophy (4). According to Susato, what constitutes an Enlightenment thinker is not a particular agenda or set of intellectual or political commitments. Rather, Enlightenment thinkers in early Modern and Modern Europe are connected by a "shared sensitivity" and "self-reflective view of the drastic historical changes within the ongoing unfolding of civilization" (6, 8). Though philosophers of the Enlightenment are typically thought to use philosophical investigation into human nature and society as a method for bettering society and for driving progress, Susato does not consider this a necessary condition in order to qualify as an Enlightenment figure.

The first chapter introduces Hume as a figure in the "Sceptical Enlightenment." Susato explores Hume's "spirit of scepticism" to provide a more balanced reading of the paradoxical positions he appears to embrace in his social and political thought (4, 13-4, 17, 21, 23, 59, 178-9, 273). He aims to show that Hume's scepticism about human reason results in an "awareness of the instability of civilized society and progress" and that his loyalty "to the values of modernity" is due to "his comprehension of their fragility" (23).

This 'Sceptical Enlightenment' has its "theoretical" or "philosophical basis" in the imagination and opinion (21, 29). Chapter Two situates Hume on the imagination and the association of ideas in historical context by relating his views to those of thinkers such as Hobbes, Locke, Hutcheson, Malebranche and Mandeville. Susato seeks to show how other commentators have overlooked how Hume's account of association and the imagination are significant for his "science of man" (28). Hume extends the association of ideas to his moral, political and social philosophy to show how human conventions develop as "an inevitable consequence of the variable workings of the human imagination" (22, 28).

In the third chapter, Susato discusses such thinkers as Hobbes, Locke, Shaftesbury and Bayle to "enhance" the notion of opinion in Hume's historical and political writings (67). Opinion, not an original contract or ancient constitution, serves as the basis of political legitimacy and authority. According to Susato, Hume's original contribution was the "meta-recognition of the very changeability of opinion" (86). A "philosophical mind" should read historical narratives of how practices haves changed to prevent present established opinion from degenerating into fanaticism.

Chapters Four to Seven move from Hume's methodological foundations to his substantive views about luxury, democracy, and human civilization. Chapter Four compares Hume on luxury with Mandeville, Montesquieu, Rousseau and Smith. Hume thought the "enjoyment of luxury" could "refine social intercourse" and this sort of conversation would "indirectly contribute to the cultivation of morals" (22, 126). Against many of his contemporaries, Hume saw luxury as necessarily consequence of the arts and industry and rejected the view that it necessarily led to moral and intellectual torpor (125). He sought to distinguish between innocent and vicious luxury -- where "innocent" and "vicious" were  matters of degree -- and to propose institutional solutions to prevent it from coming to support political factions and religious hypocrisy (126).

Susato next turns to Hume's attempt to mitigate the "adverse" consequences of religious and political dogmatism (177). Hume's attitude toward religious institutions is the subject of the fifth chapter. Susato examines the tension between his criticisms of the priesthood and false religion and his alleged conservatism in support of established religious institutions as well as his favor of superstition in the History of England (133). Susato finds that the criticism of priesthood remains the "keynote" in Hume's writings on religious institutions and his remarks on the alleged support of the established church are ironic or "sardonic" -- in fact, an "inevitable outcome of his anti-clericalism" (168, 152). His support for the national church comes from the need to prevent conflict by containing religious factions and the priesthood, not from any positive role envisaged for state religion.

Chapter Six explores the 1754 essay "Idea of a Perfect Commonwealth" in relation to his other political writings, the History of England, and the works of other utopian theorists. Hume dismisses as chimerical utopias such as those of Plato and More that deny the universality and inalterability of human nature. Hume's Perfect Commonwealth, despite its utopian setting, presents feasible institutional proposals compatible with the imperfectability of human nature (209).

The seventh chapter is on Hume's "cyclical view of civilisation" where countries' periods of cultural progress are followed by decline (23, 214). Susato attempts to reconcile this cyclical view of history that seems at odds with Enlightenment views of progress with Hume's "status as one of the champions of modern civilisation" (215-16). According to Susato, the cyclical view serves to support modern civilization by drawing attention to the fragility and vulnerability of the institutions that make it possible (238).

The eighth and final chapter examines the reception of Hume's philosophy and history in the later 18th and the 19th centuries. This varied from J. S. Mill's influential assessment that Hume's scepticism made him politically conservative to the appropriation of some of his views by radicals such as Mary Wollstonecraft and William Godwin.

Susato provides a great deal of compelling philosophical analysis, attention to historical context and careful textual exegesis. He makes judicious contributions to a number of interpretive debates in the secondary literature. Most readers will learn from his discussion of the connection between associationism and Epicureanism in the 18th century and from how Hume's treatment of opinion draws on and differs from that of his predecessors and contemporaries. Susato's navigation of Hume's pro-luxury and anti-religious stances (especially compared to Voltaire's views) is compelling and his subtle reading of the "Idea of a Perfect Commonwealth" illuminates a notoriously difficult text.

Nonetheless the question remains whether the "somewhat oxymoronic" concept of Sceptical Enlightenment is a cogent label for Hume as a social and political thinker (24). We might reject the usefulness of characterizing Hume under a broad label. One of Hume's most compelling qualities is the resistance of his thought to pigeonholing -- his sceptical disposition enabled him to give careful attention to context, to withhold judgment when warranted, and to theorize about politics in a manner unusually uncontaminated by ideology. Susato himself provides some grounds for this view by qualifying his own position. In the Introduction, he claims that it is "necessary to choose a concept that enables us to best comprehend the essential features of Hume as an Enlightenment thinker" (9). But at the conclusion of the book he expresses strong reservations against putting a label on Hume's philosophy. He notes that Hume can be variously interpreted as a Moderate, Radical or Counter-Enlightenment thinker or classified as a conservative, liberal or utilitarian, and at the same time "he can be rejected from any of them" (283). He suggests that instead of "thrusting Hume into any one particular category, it seems more fruitful to comprehend why his social philosophy has been so variously exploited" (283). He then declares in the final paragraph of the book that "Hume continues to confound almost all classifications of thought, whether those of his time, those which emerged later to define the period, or even our own present categories of philosophical inquiry" (283).

If we assume that one wishes to provide a category for analyzing Hume's social and political work, we might then ask whether Sceptical Enlightenment is the most perspicuous one. There are grounds for doubt about both the Sceptical and the Enlightenment components. The challenge of designating Hume as an Enlightenment figure concerns the murkiness of what constitutes an Enlightenment figure and the way the subtlety of Hume's thought continues to elude categorization. Enlightenments have proliferated in recent years -- moderate, radical, pragmatic -- to the point where the term may not be particularly informative. Susato intends to provide the "most inclusion possible" with his definition of the Enlightenment as a "shared sensitivity" to questions raised by thinkers surrounding the "on-going process of civilization" (6-7). One concern with Susato's definition is that it may include just about every significant early modern and modern philosopher, including Burke and possibly even Maistre. But if we narrow the definition of Enlightenment so that its figures maintain an unambiguous commitment to reason, human progress, and political authority, then Hume's place in the tradition is far from straightforward.

The Sceptical component also faces difficulties. Hume's scepticism remains a much contested issue. He has been variously interpreted as a radical sceptic or a moderate sceptic or both a radical and moderate sceptic. Susato limits discussion to the moderate scepticism recommended by Hume in the final section of the Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding. Susato understands this scepticism to be mainly directed at religious dogmatism (14-15). Hume's Sceptical Enlightenment becomes then "his distinctive way" of defending "the core of modern values, while avoiding falling into any kind of dogmatism" (21). But scepticism of religious dogmatism is not as peculiar to Hume as Susato allows (15) and Hume's scepticism is far more wide-ranging than anti-dogmatism. Susato does not enter in "detailed discussions about the status of Hume's scepticism" in epistemological matters; he thinks it is enough to demonstrate how that "his scepticism is not limited to epistemology" (13). The difficulty here is that Hume himself rarely drew parallels between his philosophical scepticism and his politics. Susato admits that "Hume does not explicitly apply specific doctrines of scepticism" to his social and political philosophy but seeks to show nonetheless that "the spirit of scepticism" is present "even in his non-metaphysical writings" (13). This means that he needs to extrapolate considerably from Hume's texts to build his case. Unfortunately, many of the examples Susato presents seem better described as instances of Hume's anti-dogmatism and his acknowledgement of the complexity and contingency of the political world. Susato claims that Hume's criticisms of rationalism, social contract theory, and doubts about progress are based on his scepticism rather than his conservatism (21). But Hume rejects each of these positions not because of any fundamental doubts about their justification, but rather because he believes rationalism and social contract theory involve false commitments and beliefs and because the very mechanisms that lead the arts and science toward perfection also tend to cause their decline.

Despite these reservations about Susato's master categories, scepticism about Hume as a proponent of a 'Sceptical Enlightenment' does not detract from the book's many merits. It is a worthy addition to the scholarship on Hume's social and political philosophy.