Hume's Science of Human Nature: Scientific Realism, Reason, and Substantial Explanation

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David Landy, Hume's Science of Human Nature: Scientific Realism, Reason, and Substantial Explanation, Routledge, 2017, 278pp., $140.00, ISBN 9781138503137.

Reviewed by Hsueh Qu, National University of Singapore


If we are to view the Treatise of Human Nature as a systematic and cohesive work, we must see Hume's varied investigations as following a consistent and cogent methodology. What is the nature of this methodology? This is the question that David Landy looks to answer in his latest book. Broadly, this monograph argues for a novel take on Hume's understanding of scientific explanation, which undergirds his investigation of the human mind. Crucial to this methodology is the notion of a 'perceptible model' (p.4), involving an experiential model for theoretical posits, with the determinate respects of similarity and differences from concrete experience made clear (akin to Bohr's model of the atom). In arguing for this view, Landy rejects two interpretations: first, the 'Deductive-Nomological account' (henceforth 'DN model'), which takes Hume's methodology to be one of merely subsuming phenomena under increasingly general and comprehensive principles; second, the 'New Humean' view, which takes Hume to hold that the explanans of empirical regularities are unknowable essences beyond our ken. Landy maintains that the former is mistaken in taking empirical generalisations to be the explanans rather than explicandum, rendering it overly superficial as a scientific methodology; the latter goes wrong in thinking that the explanans of scientific investigation is unknowable, which renders such a methodology ultimately empty.

Landy makes the case for his interpretation over the course of six chapters (excluding the introduction). Chapter 1 makes the case that the simple/complex and impression/idea distinctions commit Hume to a substantive scientific realism. Chapter 2 argues, on the basis of this, that the DN model is the wrong, and the perceptible model is the right, reading of Hume on scientific explanation. Chapter 3 investigates how it is that we can represent the substance that underlies experience, thus allowing for substantial explanation (that is, explanation that appeals to the nature or essence of whatever it is that underlies experience). Chapters 4-6 then apply this framework, showing that it makes sense of Hume's positions on a variety of topics: the external world, necessary connection, and personal identity, respectively.

In Chapter 1, Landy first argues that Hume's theory of representation is as follows. Simple ideas represent what they are copied from. Meanwhile, complex ideas represent the objects of their constituent simple ideas as being arranged in the particular manner in which the complex idea arranges its constituent concepts. The schema is as follows: 'x'R'y' represents xRy. Landy proceeds to argue that some general representations genuinely carve at the joints, which is to say they reflect the underlying nature or essence of the human mind. He then argues that simple ideas are theoretical posits, since we never experience a simple idea by itself, but only as a part of complex ideas. Moreover, both the simple/complex and idea/impression distinctions reveal a commitment to a scientific realism, insofar as these distinctions cannot be construed nominalistically (as concerning only our patterns of association, rather than any genuine underlying substantial phenomena).

Chapter 2 spells out Landy's interpretation in more detail, going into the nitty-gritty of the perceptible model. He undermines the DN model, arguing that the texts usually adduced in favour of such an interpretation do not necessitate such a reading, and are in fact compatible with the account of substantial explanation that he attributes to Hume. More specifically, Landy argues that Hume is not opposed to substantial explanation in itself, but only takes issue with it when the explicandum lacks any descriptive content, and hence explanatory power. Importantly, this leaves open the perceptible model: descriptive content is available for Hume's theoretical posits insofar as determinate differences and similarities to experience are made clear.

Chapter 3 turns to Hume's treatment of substance, and looks to establish how we can use a general term to represent the substance that underlies experience, despite experience being all that we have access to. Here, I particularly enjoyed Landy's framing of the difference between the vulgar, the false philosopher, and the true philosopher as one consisting in their employing different languages (with correspondingly different theoretical commitments). Landy argues that by transitioning from the languages of the vulgar and false philosophy to the language of true philosophy, we come to be able to represent what it is that undergirds phenomena: only the latter language, and not the former two, carries robust ontological implication. He ends by investigating the role of reason in this, offering a teleological account: while both reason and the imagination are recombinatorial faculties, reason has, and the imagination lacks, the function of explaining regularities. Landy concludes the chapter by arguing that this conception of reason suggests that Hume admits of not only inductive (probable) reasoning and deductive (demonstrable) reasoning, but also abductive reasoning, that is, inference to the best explanation.

Chapter 4 examines the external world in light of this framework of scientific explanation. Along the way, Landy takes on the New Hume interpretation, in particular, its dependence on Hume's brief mention of a 'relative idea' (THN The chapter makes the case that Hume rejects both the systems of the false and vulgar philosophers insofar as they fail to explain determinate similarities and differences between experience and their respective posits. Moreover, both systems are ultimately founded on the imagination rather than reason. Furthermore, the vulgar system is incompatible with empirical evidence; meanwhile, despite purporting to offer an alternative to it, false philosophy is in fact parasitic on the language of the vulgar, and thus inherits its problems. Rather, Hume finds that the supposed constancy and coherence of our perceptions does not call for any deeper explanation, given that these features are the results not of reason, but the imagination.

Chapter 5 turns to the topic of necessary connection. Landy takes this topic to be crucial to his interpretation in two ways. First, like the external world, it is a key instance of the general framework that he attributes to Hume: Hume rejects the notion of necessary connection as the vulgar and false philosophers conceive it on the basis that such a notion is not something we can experience, nor justifiably posit. However, the issue has deeper significance as well. The chapter argues that we can in fact have a notion of substantial explanation without having to appeal to any problematic notion of necessary connection. This might be thought to give rise to a regress, insofar as, without any notion of genuine necessity, substantial explanation can only appeal to underlying regularities in the substance, which then require further explanation, and so forth. Landy sidesteps this worry by arguing that in the context of attributing a property of the nature of a thing, such an attribution can serve as an explanans without requiring further explanation.

Chapter 6 finishes with Hume's second thoughts regarding personal identity in the Appendix. Landy argues that Hume's dissatisfaction with the account offered in THN 1.4.6 stems from the fact that it only describes the regularities that constitute the mind, rather than offering any substantial explanation of them. However, these regularities call for a substantial explanation, but Hume has argued that no such explanation is possible in this case, which leaves him trapped between a rock and a hard place: his theoretical framework requires a substantial explanation for personal identity, but his arguments that there can be no such thing seem sound.

The book is deeply iconoclastic. This novelty is not for novelty's sake, but carries significant payoffs. If Landy's interpretation is correct, then it will turn out that Hume's naturalistic project is a much more sophisticated one than it might first appear. Moreover, the framework that the book attributes to Hume provides the resources with which to resolve a host of interpretive issues, as Landy capably sets out. However, one cannot be novel without also being controversial. In light of this, it is hardly surprising that, while Landy adroitly argues for his thesis with scholarly care and finesse, I nevertheless register a number of disagreements. Here I will raise two issues: first, whether it is true that simple ideas are theoretical posits; second, whether Hume would be happy to admit theoretical posits in light of his rejection of the teleological argument for God's existence.

That simple ideas are theoretical posits seems crucial to Landy's view, insofar as it constitutes a substantial part of the motivation for thinking that Hume appeals to theoretical posits that go beyond what we can experience. Landy's rationale for this claim is that our phenomenology is always complex along several dimensions; thus, our revival set for 'simple idea' will consist of complex ideas (p.33). Insofar as this is the case, the notion of simple ideas is a theoretical posit, analogous to the postulation of insensible atoms (p.38).

However, even granting that our phenomenology is always complex, it does not follow that our revival set for 'simple idea' will consist only of complex ideas. For, as Hume points out:

Nothing is more free than the imagination of man; and though it cannot exceed that original stock of ideas, furnished by the internal and external senses, it has unlimited power of mixing, compounding, separating, and dividing these ideas, in all the varieties of fiction and vision (EHU 5.2).

This power of the imagination can certainly be used in constructing our revival sets. For instance, my revival set of 'unicorn' involves not my ideas of actual experiences of unicorns (all none of them), but rather imaginatively constructed ideas of unicorns. Why can we not similarly imaginatively divide our ideas of complex experiences until we arrive at mental atoms, that is, simple ideas? Indeed, if this is denied, then Landy's account ends up proving too much. For tables would become theoretical posits: just as Landy maintains that our revival set for 'simple idea' is constituted not by simple ideas, but rather by ideas of complexes involving simple ideas, it would be equally true that our revival sets of 'table' would be constituted by ideas of complexes involving tables, rather than ideas of tables themselves (we never experience a table by itself, after all).

Landy might respond by agreeing that such an imaginative process takes place, but maintaining that the constituents of the revival set of 'simple idea' would still be complex, insofar as the free acts of the imagination involve a complex phenomenology: when successfully dividing up a complex idea into simples, we would experience an impression of volition to perform this mental act, along with the vivacity of the ideas, and so forth. However, this seems to conflate the process with the outcome: while the process of dividing is phenomenologically complex, the outcome of the process is not. So, I require more convincing if I am to agree that simple ideas are theoretical posits.

Another potential source of concern for Landy's interpretation comes from Hume's criticisms of the teleological argument for God. The argument takes some phenomena (the regularity, beauty, and apparent design in the universe), and, on the basis of this, analogically postulates the existence of the creator in order to explain these phenomena. So far, this does not look dissimilar to Landy's explanatory framework involving theoretical posits. Moreover, the proponent of this argument is able to adduce similarities to and differences from determinate experience, as Cleanthes does in the Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion: the creator is similar to an architect (DNR 2.8), say, but different insofar as the creator is far wiser, more benevolent, and more powerful than a human designer.[1]

Of course, Hume rejects the teleological argument, in his own voice, and also in Philo's. Some of his criticisms target the specific nature of the Deity postulated, accusing typical proponents of the argument of reasoning poorly by analogy, which is unproblematic for Landy's account: perhaps the postulation of a Creator is fine in itself, even if the particular qualities attributed to this being outrun the bounds of appropriate probable reasoning.

However, some of his criticisms target the postulation of a creator at all, which seems more worrisome. Importantly, at the close of Section 11 of the Enquiry, Hume states: 'I must doubt whether it be possible for a cause to be known only by its effect' (EHU 11.30). Note that this description is true of the methodology of theoretical posits, whereby a cause is postulated solely on the basis of its effects: if this feature is problematic for the teleological argument, it is equally problematic for theoretical posits.

It is true that in expounding on this point, Hume cites the singular nature of the creator-universe pair, which might not be thought to apply to Landy's theoretical posits. But Hume is clear that this singularity is problematic insofar as it precludes 'both the effect and cause' from bearing 'a similarity and resemblance to other effects and causes, which we know, and which we have found, in many instances, to be conjoined with each other' (ibid.). Again, this critique equally applies to theoretical posits. Substantial underlying natures are such that we cannot 'know' them, nor 'find' them to be conjoined with the surface phenomena we suppose them to explain. Thus, in inferring a theoretical posit, we are unable to point to our experience of similar constant conjunctions, since such a cause-effect pair is something we cannot have experienced. It is true that Landy maintains that in the case of theoretical posits, Hume can adduce looser similarities, and also certain differences, to determinate experience. But, as pointed out above, the same is true with regard to the postulation of a creator God, and Hume nevertheless maintains that the lack of experience of such a causal pair is problematic in this case, which seems to also extends to the case of theoretical posits. This presents some awkwardness for seeing Hume as committed to the methodology of theoretical posits.

That said, these disagreements should not unduly detract from what is an excellent and deeply novel monograph. Landy offers a powerful and original interpretation of Hume and ably marshals texts in defence of it. It merits serious discussion and engagement. I have no doubt that the book might venture beyond the interpretive comfort zones of some scholars. But I do not think that this is a bad thing. The book constitutes a welcome addition to the literature.

[1] Thus, I disagree that ‘our representation of the Deity has no perceptible model’ (p.221); unlike ‘mystics’ such as Demea (DNR 4.1), Cleanthes and his fellow ‘Anthropomorphites’ (DNR 4.12) do not take the nature of God to be ineffable, but rather model it on what we find in experience. Landy is right to point out a key dissimilarity between arguments by analogy and substantial explanation, which is that unlike the latter, the former do not offer deeper underlying explanations (pp.220–3), but only further causes at the same level of explanation. However, this does not affect my point, which is that whatever differences obtain between the two, Hume levies a criticism of the former that seems to equally apply to the latter.